Plato's Utopia Recast: His Later Ethics and Politics

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Christopher Bobonich, Plato's Utopia Recast: His Later Ethics and Politics, Oxford, 2002, 400pp, $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199251436.

Reviewed by Christopher Rowe, University of Durham


The scope of Plato’s Utopia Recast is inevitably broader than its subtitle might by itself suggest. Bobonich (henceforth ’B’) has to discuss exactly what is ’recast’: where Plato’s ’later ethics and politics’ came from, and how exactly they differ from their earlier (actually, in standard terms, ’middle-period’) counterparts. So while B’s focus is on the Laws, he also has a great deal to say about the Republic, and also the Phaedo – from which the main argument of the book starts. (Other works – Timaeus, Philebus, Theaetetus – are also used to help to fill the gaps left in the Laws’ account of certain topics: see below.) B’s book gives us a picture of a Plato who (a) typically tells us just what he is thinking at any one moment, and (b) whose thinking is in a continuous state of evolution towards – what B ever so gently suggests one might think of as – better solutions. In these respects, the book belongs to what is by now a well-established tradition of Platonic interpretation, which sees the dialogues as a kind of laboratory from which well-formed philosophical ideas gradually emerge after some early – or in B’s case ’middle’ – failures; a type of interpretation that also worries rather little about the form, or forms, in which the dialogues are written, on the assumption that their meaning can be grasped sufficiently well if only we apply the right doses of philosophical attention (and, if necessary, of philosophical ’charity’, though in fact B is characteristically much slower than most to find Plato needing any such thing).

Yet one should make no mistake about it: this is also a thoroughly un-traditional book, which sets out to change our perspective on Plato’s later thinking – and particularly on the Laws. While much has been done, especially by the late Trevor Saunders, and by André Laks, to salvage the reputation of this much-maligned, long, and not – one has to admit it – particularly readable work, it has tended still to seem isolated from the rest of Plato’s late writing, not least because it has seemed to have so little that is philosophical about it; philosophy will not, it seems, even have a particularly significant role in the city of Magnesia whose outlines the three interlocutors sketch over the course of its twelve books. If B is right, however, the Laws ought rather to be seen as the end-point of the development in Plato’s thinking on ethics, on politics, and also – and especially – on moral psychology, and as continuous with, because implicitly building on, those universally recognized philosophical tours de force, the Philebus and the Theaetetus. (The Timaeus – another less fashionable work, at least until recently, though still not as unfashionable as Laws – also has an important role in B’s account, showing Plato well on the road to his later positions, especially in the treatment of the irrational.) This general proposal about the relationship between Laws and other later dialogues looks not only interesting but perfectly plausible – and distinctly more attractive than the idea that the Laws is evidence of a prolonged, tired, and morose old age.

But B’s thesis also has a distinct beauty about it, insofar as it finds the justification for the Laws’ unphilosophical aspect in the very sophistication of the philosophical ideas that underlie it. The basic question B asks is this (for reasons of brevity, I put it rather less circumspectly than does B himself): how is it that Plato can propose that the citizens of Magnesia, most of whom will be non-philosophers, will be happy, when it seems to have been his earlier view – as expressed in Phaedo and Republic – that philosophy is, without exception, the sine qua non of human happiness? Answer: because of changes in his epistemology and psychology, the most important such change being the abandonment of the parts-of-the-soul doctrine advanced in the Republic and (according to B) prefigured in the idea of the opposition between soul and body in the Phaedo, and the substitution for that doctrine of a more unified conception of human agency and motivation.

What consigns the non-philosophers of the Republic to misery, according to B, is that their ’goals are … set by entities which cannot grasp genuine value properties, [entities] such as the body in the Phaedo or the lower parts of the soul in the Republic’ (B, p.92). ’For Plato, the essential task of ethical reasoning is to form and act upon an appreciation of the features that make justice and everything else that is choiceworthy genuinely fine or good and thus genuinely deserving of choice. The ethical value of an action requires the right sort of direction by the Reasoning part because the ethical value of an action is (at least partially) constituted by the fact that it expresses an appropriate response to, that is, an appreciation of, genuine value’ (p.85). And the problem, for non-philosophers, is that ’[g]enuine value properties are non-sensible and a proper conception of them cannot be derived from the contents of perception’ (p.86); restricting themselves to what they can see, hear, and touch, they can only end up lying in the mud, as the Socrates of the Phaedo puts it (or worse: the resources of myth give him even more picturesque ways of describing the plight of those unfortunates who distance themselves from philosophical reflection). Just as the senses are there to lead us to ’a grasp of non-sensible principles of order’, and are wasted if they fail to do that (Timaeus), so ’the two lower parts of the soul in the Republic … exist to enable the proper functioning of the Reasoning part’, and ’[t]o the extent that they serve only their own purposes, they, too, are in vain’ (p.88).

B tries hard not to be judgmental about all this, finding a partial parallel with Kant, and concluding (in the sentence following the one just cited) that ’Plato’s conception of a virtuous agent is not merely an intellectualist eccentricity’. But if there was ever faint praise, this is probably it; or if it is not, most people would surely, and reasonably, find unappealing the consequences of what is alleged here to be ’Plato’s conception’. In any case, B passes directly on to the Laws at this point: a work which, B claims, not only asserts that legislation must aim at making all the citizens virtuous (an idea that, in some form or other, is also present in the Republic), but allows that – despite their being, most of them, non-philosophers – they, or some of them, can grasp ’genuine value’, which on B’s account of Plato’s position is a condition of genuine happiness. (Citizens of Magnesia will even have a basis for valuing virtue in others ’for its own sake’, as the citizens of the Republic did not; genuine cooperation, then, would obtain in Magnesia, in a way that it would not in Callipolis.) To cut a long story short, and so no doubt, from B’s perspective, to oversimplify and even falsify it, the Republic envisages parts of the soul that are like homunculi, each not only with its own desires and pleasures, but a pretty full set of ’conceptual and cognitive capacities: (i) each has beliefs, (ii) each has practical goals, (iii) each can engage in some forms of reasoning, including reasoning about what to do, and (iv) each can communicate with the others: one part can persuade another and they can all agree’ (p.220). Small wonder that agents constituted like this, and without Philosophy on hand to succour them, should be in terminal trouble. But then, in the course of Philebus, Timaeus and Theaetetus, Plato moves to a position where ’a lower part limited to perception [can no longer] be a subject that initiates choice and action. Perception cannot get to (even a very crude conception of) “good” or “pleasant” and cannot engage in any form of reasoning about the future or undertake any sort of comparison. A lower part limited to perception understood in this way could not possibly play the end-setting role that the lower parts did in the Republic, and we would have to appeal to more than perception to explain why items (e.g. emotions and desires) associated with the lower parts have the content that they do. (Perhaps, at most, we might have impulses for, e.g., sweet things, unless the desire for sweet things is a desire for sweet things as pleasant.)’ (This is B on pp.327-8.) B finds three ’important developments’ in the Theaetetus: the dialogue ’radically impoverishes perception and may remove from it all propositional and conceptual content’, ’attributes to all human beings some contact with non-sensible properties, the commons (the koina), and holds that contact with them is involved in forming most, if not all, judgments …’, and ’holds that there is a single subject of thought and perception’. Meanwhile Philebus and Timaeus are discovered to bring non-rational motivations closer to rational judgments and ’desires formed after rational deliberation’ (p.334). All of this underpins the position of the Laws, which – B claims – allows (’at least some’) non-philosophers to be genuinely happy: to put it crudely, because these moves in Philebus and elsewhere have as their consequence the possibility of a radical upgrading of the cognitive – and even emotional – states of non-philosophers who have received the right upbringing and education, so that (as I propose to put it, though so far as I recall, B does not), the difference between them and their philosophical fellow-citizens is one of degree rather than of kind.

Even on repeated readings, I find it hard not to be carried away by B’s argument: despite its caution, and its complexity, it is an unusually compelling read, and throws open a multitude of Platonic contexts, and connections, to fresh discussion. It remains, in my view, one of the best recent books written on Plato. But that judgment, I take it, is perfectly consistent with my also profoundly disagreeing with many of the book’s conclusions. Let me focus on a single set of points, which happen to be closest to my own present preoccupations.

Most importantly, I believe that B gives a radically misleading picture of the lower parts of the soul in the Republic. This is an old and unresolved issue, but the interpretation of ’spirit’ and appetite as homunculi, each with its own beliefs and powers of reasoning as well as desires (and, of course, goals), is no more inevitable than it is philosophically attractive; it is simply the outcome of a series of hermeneutical choices that B makes, each of which seems, separately, virtuous, but which together take B – as I see it – in entirely the wrong direction. That Plato (Socrates) in the Republic specifically makes only the reasoning part human (spirit being like a lion, appetite like a many-headed monster: cf. B, p.255) is perhaps a minor point, given that he – Plato – has a habit of erasing the distinction between human and animal. However the treatment of all three parts as ’agent-like’ (pp.219-23, etc.), and the comparison with Daniel Dennett’s homunculi (ibid.), constitutes a rather less minor point. (I assume that ’agents’ are here meant to be rational ones; the lower parts will be ’agent-like’ on condition that they can do some sort of reasoning.) If ’spirit’ and appetite can determine an agent’s action independently of or even contrary to reason, that of course is not enough to make them ’agent-like’ themselves, and B needs considerably more argument than he gives if he is to take Plato as treating them in that way, especially since, so far as I can see, the conclusion of the parts-of-the-soul argument in Republic IV is consistent with the existence of merely brutish lower parts; and though there is evidently room for disagreement about the capacities of brute animals, starting from here will clearly have implications for the language that Socrates uses about ’spirit’ and appetite later in the dialogue. This is not in the least to say that B’s reading is an impossible reading of the Republic as such. But for my taste it pays too little attention to the flexibility of Platonic language, to Plato’s capacity for shifting between different perspectives on the same ideas, and above all to the overall coherence of Platonic thought, including its philosophical coherence (hence my reference to ’hermeneutical choices’ above: for all the virtues of B’s painstaking sawing apart of particular contexts, it brings with it the danger of mistaking the trees for the wood – whose very existence is already thrown into doubt by the presumption of fundamental shifts, developments in Plato’s thinking). In particular, if one looks at that part of Plato’s oeuvre which presumably forms the background to the Republic, including those dialogues we have become used to calling ’Socratic’, the concept of agent-like parts is likely to come from nowhere (except, of course, in the case of the reasoning part, which will be what makes us into agents in the first place); since on B’s account Plato abandons it pretty soon after the Republic, I for one feel content to suppose that it was never there at all.

Such a view – i.e. the one I have just advanced on my own behalf – will then lessen the distance between Republic and those later dialogues B discusses (Philebus, etc.). On the other hand, it actually sharpens the problem on which his book turns. For now, because of the city-soul analogy, Plato will by implication actually be treating non-philosophers as brutes, or at best brute-like, in the Republic, but as perfectly good examples of humanity in the Laws – even while taking much the same sort of position on human psychology and motivation in both dialogues. (As a matter of fact, B himself finds just such a position – and, I think, rightly – in the Phaedo and elsewhere: non-philosophical ’humans’ are actually brute.) So B is addressing a real problem; the discussion by no means stops here. In this as in other ways, B’s book sets a new agenda, or, alternatively, usefully sharpens up an old one.

A final point in this necessarily very selective review. Much of B’s book revolves around a thesis he attributes to Plato, labeled the ’Dependency Thesis’ (p.33, etc.). The Dependency Thesis is, very roughly, the thesis that happiness, understood as the possession of goods, depends on wisdom. From my caricature above of B’s reading of Plato, from Republic to Laws, it will be reasonably clear how he will understand the Dependency Thesis (people will only be happy if they understand why things are good; understanding why things are good involves grasping non-sensible properties; and so on). Now this understanding of the thesis will be reasonable enough, if one starts from where B starts, i.e. with Phaedo and Republic. However in epistemology as in psychology (see above), one gets a quite different perspective if one starts further back in the corpus, i.e. by the standard dating: ’virtue’/wisdom ’makes’ other things good because only through wisdom can we establish just what is good (for us); nothing apart from wisdom is always good (for us); and so on. And that, I hazard, is actually a more plausible, and certainly a less philosophically extravagant, reading of the Dependency Thesis. If such criteria – plausibility, philosophical economy – have anything to do with getting Plato right, as I think B agrees that they do, the implication will be that it would be better not to begin in the middle (i.e., with the so-called ’middle’ dialogues); better, too, to take a less piece-meal approach to the dialogues. But, as I have suggested, there are some large interpretative issues involved here.