Platonism, Naturalism, and Mathematical Knowledge

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James Robert Brown, Platonism, Naturalism, and Mathematical Knowledge, Routledge, 2011, 194pp., $130.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415872669.

Reviewed by Hans Halvorson, Princeton University


James R. Brown stages a frontal assault on recent naturalist accounts of mathematical knowledge. He begins with a bold claim: mathematical knowledge is best understood in terms of intuition of Platonic objects. Now, he doesn't offer much in the way of a positive Platonist philosophy -- you won't find a nuanced account of mathematical objects and their identity criteria, or a detailed story about how we become acquainted with them. In fact, Brown does not even take a definite stance on the more fine-grained questions of mathematical ontology, although he does hint that mathematical objects are not reducible to sets. But he provides a lucid account of the dialectic between Platonism and naturalism and many reasons for questioning the adequacy of naturalist accounts.

The book begins with a couple of general chapters, and then proceeds to critique specific naturalist proposals. In the first chapter, Brown describes one of the most prominent recent arguments in favor of mathematical Platonism: the indispensability argument. But, surprisingly, he rejects this argument, because he believes it rests on a mistaken account of how mathematical facts explain physical facts.

Brown's argument against mathematical explanations of physical phenomena is based on a more general account of the role of mathematics in the empirical sciences. Brown disputes claims by Barker and others that mathematics directly describes physical states of affairs. Rather, he says, the sciences are in the business of using mathematics to model or track physical states of affairs. More precisely, the sciences assert that there is an isomorphism between certain physical states of affairs and certain mathematical structures.

Brown raises some interesting questions about the relationship between mathematics and the physical world. However, his distinction between "describing" and "modelling" left me puzzled. For one, what does it mean for there to be an isomorphism between a mathematical structure and a physical state of affairs? Second, if a mathematical structure is isomorphic to a physical thing, then doesn't the theory of that mathematical structure also describe the physical thing? (For example, don't the axioms for Lorentzian manifolds accurately describe the structure of spacetime?) What features does the "describing" relationship have that the "modelling" relationship does not have?

While Brown rejects the indispensability argument, he claims that a Platonic account best explains the provenance of mathematical concepts. In short, says Brown, we couldn't have acquired mathematical concepts through sensory experience alone; we also need direct intuition of Platonic forms. This theme comes up briefly not only in Chapter 1, but again in Brown's criticism of Kitcher's philosophy of mathematics (Chapter 3), and also in his discussion of Maddy's claims that humans can perceive sets. With particular reference to the set concept, Brown claims that sets of the form {αα, {αα}} cannot be abstracted from our experience of spatial containment relations.

But what, you might ask, does Brown have to say about Benacerraf's argument that we cannot know anything about Platonic objects, since we don't interact causally with them? Here Brown claims that the causal theory of knowledge -- i.e. the claim that a person can know about an event only if he is causally connected to that event -- is incompatible with contemporary physics. In particular, Brown points to the example of the Bell-EPR experiment in quantum mechanics, where two spatially separated particles are in an entangled state, and where knowledge of an experimental outcome at one location provides certain knowledge of the outcome at a distant location.

But I wasn't convinced that the Bell-EPR experiment rules out causal theories of knowledge, or that it lends support to the idea that knowledge might be obtained through non-physical means such as Platonic intuition. First of all, the outcome of a Bell-EPR measurement at one location does not provide categorical knowledge of events at the distant location; it provides only hypothetical knowledge: if the other experimenter measures such and such then the result will be so and so. Second, in the Bell-EPR experiment, the two distant particles are entangled with each other, and it's this entangled (physical) state that explains the experimenter's ability to gain knowledge of the distant outcome. Being entangled is a physical relation: the strict correlation between the particles is explained by their physical state. So while the Bell-EPR experiment might force us to modify our understanding of physical causality, it provides little comfort to advocates of non-naturalist accounts of knowledge.

The second chapter takes up another general theme, namely the question of how naturalism is to be defined. Here Brown rejects the claim that "naturalism" is impossible to define -- but neither does he try to give necessary and sufficient conditions. Instead, Brown is happy enough to gesture at some characteristics of naturalist approaches.

Brown's account of naturalism is accurate enough as a description of others' opinions, i.e. of those philosophers who call themselves naturalists. But as with many characterizations of naturalism, Brown's is circular and hence uninformative. For example, naturalism says that knowledge comes from the methods of the natural sciences. But surely we don't have any clearer sense of natural science than we do of naturalism. Is sociology a natural science? How about historical studies? And (heaven forbid!) what about theology?

Although Brown's account of naturalism is uninformative as a philosophical analysis, it sets the stage for the remainder of the book. After the second chapter, we know exactly the type of philosophical position that will be up for critique in the remainder of the book.

Chapters 3 through 7 contain the main critical assault against naturalism. These chapters are essentially independent from each other, and I encourage you to read them selectively based on your interests. Having read Chapters 1 and 2, you can read Chapter 3 for a criticism of Kitcher, Chapter 4 for criticism of Lakoff, Chapter 5 for criticism of semi-naturalists (like Quine), and Chapter 7 for a critical discussion of Maddy's "second philosophy" approach to mathematics. Brown's arguments against Kitcher, Lakoff, and the semi-naturalists are highly compelling, and should provoke some responses in the literature. Perhaps slighly less convincing is Brown's treatment of Maddy's recent turn to "second philosophy."

One of the more provocative claims in Maddy's recent work is that philosophers have little business prescribing the direction of mathematical practice (e.g. which set-theoretic axioms should be adopted by the mathematical community). Brown thinks that Maddy has gone too far, and he argues that philosophy can and should play a guiding role in mathematical practice. His first argument is by example: he describes a recent argument by Freiling and Mumford against the Continuum Hypothesis, and he claims that this argument is "philosophical." In other words, we might say that the line between philosophical thinking and mathematical thinking is blurrier than Maddy indicates. Brown's second argument is essentially an "all hell will break loose" argument: if mathematics needn't be accountable to philosophical standards of rationality, then it might as well be speculative theology! At this point, Brown assumes that theology obviously doesn't get hold of the truth, and so any philosophical account of math that makes it seem like theology must be absurd. Not only is this argument an insult to the careful thinking of theology-friendly philosophers such as Robert Adams and Alvin Plantinga, it also suppresses the obvious and interesting questions about how mathematical knowledge might be similar and dissimilar to other sorts of non-empirical knowledge. For example, if we have epistemic access to Platonic mathematical objects, then why not to other sorts of Platonic objects, like the form of the Good? And why is it that humans agree about most mathematical things, but disagree about religious, ethical, and aesthetic things? Do humans really agree about most mathematical things?

It's a shame that in an otherwise so carefully argued book, Brown felt that a reductio ad theologiam would count as a good argument against Maddy's account of mathematics. To be fair, Brown does say that there are strong philosophical arguments against God's existence; and he points to rampant religious disagreement as a reason for rejecting the idea that relgious knowledge could be grounded in intuition. But aren't there just as strong philosophical arguments against the existence of Platonic mathematical objects? And don't religious believers have explanations for how direct intuition of religious truths is compatible with rampant religious disagreement?

In summary, Brown's book presents a strong challenge to recent naturalist accounts of mathematics. Brown's criticism of these accounts might be seen as "pure" or "disinterested," since he's not an indiscriminate Platonist -- i.e. he's not committed to Platonic forms of the Good, or of Beauty, etc. But one is left wondering: if mathematics cannot be naturalized, then what other domains of human knowledge might defy naturalistic explanation?