Plato's Animals: Gadflies, Horses, Swans, and Other Philosophical Beasts

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Jeremy Bell and Michael Naas (eds.), Plato's Animals: Gadflies, Horses, Swans, and Other Philosophical Beasts, Indiana University Press, 2015, 261pp., $32.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253016171.

Reviewed by Deborah Achtenberg, University of Nevada, Reno


I love this book. Every essay is strong, and each one gives us a glimpse of a world of Plato interpretation -- of each author's particular world of Plato interpretation -- and makes us want to visit that world. In addition, each essay is well-written, and with style. The volume accomplishes a lovely combination of lightness of touch, wit, style, and depth of analysis and interpretation. For what else could one ask? Even the cover is pleasing -- with its black silhouettes of all the different types of animals -- flies, bees, ants, wolves, asses, horses, kites, hawks, sting-rays, lions, dogs, pigs, and on and on. Are there really so many? How have I missed seeing them all? And, the book invites us to reflect, how have I missed the many animals in Plato's dialogues? Of course, I have noticed them. But, have I focused on them? And on their purpose in the dialogues?

The book comes from a broadly Derridean milieu and Derrida's thinking about the animal that therefore I am. Why have we not noticed animals more? Because, the thought goes, we have distinguished them too much from ourselves based on the idea that we have reason or agency and they do not. But, are we fully agentic? No, Derrida and other postmoderns tell us. Our responses are active and passive or receptive. Are we fully rational? No, they would say, we, too, are animals. The animal that I follow (je suis) -- the animal I hunt and track down as an almost-object different from myself -- is the animal that I am (je suis).

What animals are treated in the Platonic corpus? Here are some discussed in the book. The unforgettable wolf that personifies ruthless Thrasymachus in the Republic. The swans who sing the most beautifully right before their death according to Socrates in the Phaedo. The passion-ridden dark and light horses that pull the chariot of the soul steered by intuitive reason in the Phaedrus. The desire-motivated, hybristic, circle people -- or, better, circle animals -- from whom we originated according to Aristophanes in the Symposium. The sting-ray that a frustrated Meno says Socrates resembles when Meno is stumped by ontological questions. The asses, wolves, hawks, kites, bees, wasps and ants that we might be transformed into after death according to the Phaedo. The gadfly that Socrates is described as in the Apology -- along with the sometimes overlooked sluggish horse called 'Athens' that the gad-fly must arouse. And more.

The book has seven parts with two chapters in each. The parts delineate themes: animals of fable and myth; Socrates as a gadfly and sting-ray; Socratic animals as truth-tellers and provocateurs; the political animal, the engendered animal, and the philosophical animal; and, finally, animals and the afterlife. But what are the deeper themes of the book -- themes of which a focus on the presence of animals makes us aware? One is that human beings are like animals. For example, according to S. Montgomery Ewegen in "We the Bird-Catchers," as the god spoke through swans using them as a sign, so Socrates is a sign of something beyond. Truth speaks through him as it does through poets and rhetors. This idea enriches the theme. It is not just that humans are animalic, but that humans are not as agentic as they seem. It is "not Socrates's reason that sets the order that he . . . claims he must follow. Socrates's way is one of following a given order, of giving himself over to it," Ewegen says, like the swans give themselves over to Apollo.

Similarly, for Drew A. Hyland, the teaching of the Phaedrus is about human incompleteness. It is eros that distinguishes us from animals in that dialogue, Hyland maintains. Even more, we are erotic incompleteness. Eros, the awareness of incompleteness, is our very being, where eros is not irrational, though desire is -- desire which made the original circular beings animalic or, better, monstrous. Desire lacks awareness of what will complete it, and so is infinite, hybristic and unstoppable. Desire is simple lack. Eros, to the contrary, has an intellectual vision of what would complete it. After all, Eros's mother is Poros or resource and Poros's mother is Metis or craft, strategy, wit, knowledge. But, we are only possibly aware, only possibly wise, only possibly rational, making our difference from animals only possible, not essential. Ewegen and Hyland, then, present to us the theme of ontological human vulnerability, responsiveness and openness to what is outside us. It is a central theme of Derridean thought. What is most our own is not our own according to Derrida (for example, "I only have one language, yet it is not my mine"). What is outside us is inside us, for good and ill.

Another deep theme has to do with Socrates' practice. What is it that Socrates does? Of course, as is well-known, he is a gadfly. He stings us out of complacency, especially out of the sluggishness and complacency of ignorance. This second theme is related to the first. Socrates' practice is to make us aware of our limitation, incompleteness, lack of wholeness or general need. For Michael Naas in "American Gadfly: Plato and the Problem of Metaphor," Socrates is more of a goad than a mere fly and, like a goad, he is not himself blind. There are two types of gadfly, one that goads with pricks of desire but provides no guidance, and another that pricks and pushes but has knowledge, like a charioteer who guides because he sees the way. The distinction is as central for Naas as the difference between desire and eros is for Hyland. Not a mere blind gad-fly, Socrates is a goad who has a sense of the way, a gadfly with a "sense of what is best for the city and its inhabitants," Naas says, namely, that virtue and the things of the soul are more important than wealth and material goods.

For Jeremy Bell in "Taming Horses and Desires: Plato's Politics of Care," Socrates' practice is taming the soul by fostering tame desires. Tyranny develops as an extension of the lack of self-care found in democracy. Socrates wants to foster desires for self-care, rather than tyrannical desires, in democracy. Such self-care is understood as a return to the self, a regrowing of animal wings we possessed before we were born, wings that elevate us to a place of intellectual vision, specifically, a vision of noetic beauty. "Socrates educates his interlocutors in the limits of their knowledge," Bell says, "and trains them to care for themselves." The desire for such self-care results from Socrates' practice of engendering awareness of incompleteness, specifically and famously, awareness of ignorance.

Interestingly, then, for Bell and Naas, what is central to Socratic practice is what Hyland found central to human being, a way of being outside the self that makes us tamer and less blind. Bell and Naas, it seems to me, identify that way with something animalic -- a goading gadfly for Naas and a winged animal for Bell. For Hyland, the way is identified with what distinguishes us from our animal nature, namely, eros, the guided drive for overcoming lack, similar to or perhaps occurring directly after Naas's notion of a guided goad or prick to activity. Is there a contradiction of theme, then? Is it what is animalic in us that gives us the guided impetus towards what is best in life, or is our ability to respond to a guided push toward what is good what distinguishes us from animals? Alternately, are some of the animals referenced in Plato's Animals mere motifs while others point to deeper ontological substance? I am inclined to the latter view, though I do not have a final opinion.

If Socrates' practice is to goad us out of epistemological complacency toward a good of which he has some divination, and if human being is more open than epistemological and other types of complacency would indicate, another theme of the book is that of basic, irresolvable tensions in human existence. Human beings are not complete, finished, settled and at rest, but in certain respects permanently tense and in motion. Marina McCoy, in "The City of Sows and Sexual Differentiation in the Republic," points us to the fact that the famous "city of pigs" -- the healthy city in the Republic, the one that precedes the more developed city described in some detail later in the work -- would better be translated as "city of sows." Many of the elements of the healthy city, a city unappealing and low to Glaucon, are found in the Thesmophoria, a gynocentric festival to Demeter, McCoy points out. Glaucon's rejection of it, then, is not just a desire for sauces or spices, or a saucier or spicier life, but is a rejection of femininity. In fact, she points out, the term for sow is a Greek slang term for female genitalia, and sow jokes were common in Greek comedy. Glaucon's rejection, then, is a rejection of feminine practices playing a central role in political life. Political matters are not feminine. Politics is male and public; the feminine is apolitical and private; the feminine is cyclical and does not make a mark like the historical. Socrates' city of sows, then, "subverts this usual Greek division of public and private, political and familiar, masculine and feminine" and, similarly, Socrates' practice of private questioning is most political, according to him, since politics needs an intellectual vision of the human good. Tensions are permanent in Socrates, we could say, rather than resolved. Socrates can go either way: public or private, male or female, historical or cyclical. After all, he styles himself as a midwife.

Similarly, Heidi Northwood, in "Making Music with Aesop's Fables in the Phaedo," makes philosophy more similar to fable than we often like to think it is. Do not many introductory ancient philosophy courses begin by showing the difference between philosophy and myth or fable? Why are such distinctions so important to us? Why can we not accept more tension in our lives and practices? We want a disembodied pure reason called 'philosophy' just as we want a political, masculine, mark-making politics. But, when Socrates composed for the one and only time at the end of his life -- specifically, composed metrical versions of Aesop's fables -- perhaps he did so because fable is not so different from philosophy. The messages in the Phaedo, for example, are not so different from those in Aesop's fables, Northwood says. The specific animals mentioned in that dialogue were meant to echo those in the fables. For example, the idea found in the dialogues that we will be transformed into different animals in the afterlife depending on how we lived here -- gluttonous people into asses; unjust people into wolves, hawks, kites; more social people into bees, wasps, ants -- echoes ideas found in the fables about animals, for example, in "Zeus and the Ant" in which a greedy person is turned into an ant that must attain its sustenance from the others whom he previously wished to take from, and in a variety of other Aesopian fables.

In very simple ways, then, these essays (and the remaining ones, each equally deserving of detailed discussion), bring to light basic Derridean and postmodern themes: the not completely agentic but open, dependent, responsive and vulnerable quality of human nature; practices for goading us in a guided, envisioned, way out of closed complacency into such open responsiveness; the presence in our lives of basic tensions and oppositions that need and reflect each other rather than ruling each other: public and private, male and female, historical and cyclical, and, in the spirit of this lovely volume we must add, human and animal.

Plato's Animals is a strong volume of beautifully written paeans to postmodern themes found in premodern thought, specifically found in the thought crystallized by the image of a complex and incomplete Socrates who can go either way: public or private, gymnastics or music, male or female, and, central to this volume, animal or human being.