Plato’s Epistemology: Being and Seeming

Plato S Epistemology Being And Seeming

Jessica Moss, Plato’s Epistemology: Being and Seeming, Oxford University Press, 2021, 258pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198867401.

Reviewed by Jan Szaif, University of California, Davis


How does Plato’s epistemology compare to our contemporary notions of knowledge and belief? Is Plato even talking about the same kinds of cognitive states when he discusses the difference between epistêmê (usually translated as “knowledge”) and doxa (translated as “belief” or “opinion”)? If not, what motivates his approach, and can we still relate to it? These questions are the starting point for Jessica Moss in her new book on Plato’s epistemology. She argues that Plato maintains an object-based epistemology: Cognitive states are individuated and defined not by a difference in justification or evidential support, but by their different object domains, and they receive their characteristic qualities from their objects. Her interpretation revives and sharpens a past tradition of reading Plato, consciously departing from much of the more recent literature on Plato’s epistemology. Her argument is clearly structured, with close attention to the Platonic texts, but also numerous contextualizations in the broader framework of ancient Greek philosophy and literature. Plato’s concept of epistêmê is analyzed in Chapters 1–5, the complementary concept of doxa in 6–8. The analysis is based on what Moss calls the two-worlds dialogues in Plato’s oeuvre (especially Phaedo, Republic, Phaedrus, and Timaeus). Chapters 9 and 10 add a somewhat more tentative comparison with Plato’s epistemology in his earlier dialogues and the Theaetetus. I’ll comment on the argument of Chapters 1–8.

According to the Distinct Objects claim defended by Moss, epistêmê and doxa range over different, non-overlapping sets of objects. For the modern reader, this is a very puzzling notion, especially if it should be case that epistêmê and doxa signify something roughly similar to our notions of knowledge and opinion or mere belief. For this would have the manifestly absurd consequence that one person’s mere opinion and another person’s knowledge could not be directed at the same object or state of affairs. But surely, I can know that I am currently writing a review, whereas the editor might merely opine it; and similarly with respect to necessary truths such as mathematical theorems. Accordingly, interpreters have frequently looked for ways to avoid this apparently absurd assumption of separate object domains. Yet frequent assertions in the two-worlds dialogues, taken at face value, strongly suggest that the domain of doxa corresponds to the things of the perceptible world subject to change, whereas the domain of epistêmê contains the eternal and unchanging entities that can be grasped only with the intellect—the so-called Platonic forms or essences—and that there is a sharp ontological divide between the two domains. If these allocations are taken strictly, without overlap, the consequence will be, for instance, that there can be no doxa of the form or ideal essence of justice, but also no epistêmê regarding concrete cases of justice and injustice in one’s social environment. Wouldn’t this undermine the very core of Socratic and Platonic philosophizing, namely, their mission of promoting philosophy as the way to discover what it means for individuals and societies to live more just, virtuous, and happy lives? Moss acknowledges these concerns, but sets out to defend the Distinct Objects thesis in its strictest form, aiming to show that Plato’s epistemology is not just “a muddled or nascent version of our own, but something radically different, [...] and compelling in its own right” (10).

Moss chooses Republic 476e–480a as her main starting point. She does not offer a comprehensive analysis of this notoriously problematic argument, but harvests it for its doctrinal content, highlighting especially the idea that epistêmê is a cognitive “power set over that which is,” while doxa is a power directed at an ontologically inferior domain between being and not-being. Chapter 1 has the preliminary goal of proving that “it is admissible to read Plato as holding that epistemic powers are individuated by their objects” (18). It sets this “Distinct Objects reading” in opposition to three alternative types of interpretation that have endorsed some form of overlap between the object domains of epistêmê and doxa. A brief historical excursus serves to document that the Distinct Objects reading was dominant in ancient Platonism and modern-era Plato scholarship until around 1960, when it came to be seen as problematic. Chapter 2 seeks to demonstrate that cognitive powers, as well as their correlating types of accomplishment, are not only individuated, but also defined by their objects in a non-tautological way. “It is the objects that make them what they are” (50). For natural powers in general are adapted to their objects, and these objects are what they are independently of the power fitted to them (as in the case of the power of sight, the activity of seeing, and color as their object; cf. R. 477c–e). Moss connects this with the idea, familiar already from Presocratic philosophy, that perception and cognition function on a like-by-like basis. Forms are “clean,” perceptibles are “messy,” and this shapes the corresponding cognitive powers and accomplishments. The chapter concludes with the thesis that Platonic epistêmê is “best understood not as knowledge in the ordinary sense, but as a deep grasp of ultimate reality” (85). Chapter 3 expands on this notion of “ultimate reality.” Taking a cue from R. 476e–480a, Moss suggests that being is by definition the object of Platonic epistêmê and that this is, in fact, a truism in the context of Greek thinking. This truism turns into something non-trivial because of how Plato links it to metaphysics. For “being” comes to denote a “privileged status among all the things that exist” (95). The meaning of this privileged status is fleshed out through certain ontological contrasts which set “being,” or the unique intelligible forms, in opposition to their many likenesses or images in the perceptible world, characterized by being-and-not-being, becoming, or seeming. She argues that the marks of “real” being point to the idea of a foundational reality underlying the phenomenal world: “the real is the fundamental” (102), and epistêmê is “the kind of cognition suited to grasp being” (112). In Chapter 4 she proceeds to show how the main characteristics of Platonic epistêmê (viz., truth, explanation, clarity/precision and stability, and the restriction to forms) result from the principles that cognition is like-by-like and epistemic cognition is directed at being. Chapter 5 summarizes the results and again highlights how Platonic object-defined epistêmê differs from modern conceptions that treat all facts equally as potential topics of knowledge.

Based on the observation that the noun doxa and its verbal correlate dokein can denote either a certain cognitive state in the cognizer or the quality of “seeming” or “appearing” in the cognized object, Chapter 6 argues that it is a conceptual truth for Plato that doxa is a response to seeming. Platonic doxa is, hence, a cognition not of what is, but of what seems (153), failing to penetrate beyond the appearances (cf. 85). This seeming isn’t just a deficient cognitive state, but defines a distinct “ontological realm of seemings or appearances” (145), standing between true reality and mere illusions. (Images are an example of this ontological category.) Chapter 7 seeks to demonstrate how the basic conception of doxa as cognition attached to seeming explains the other characteristics of Platonic doxa, such as its lack of contact with the truth, its instability, and (most importantly) its restriction to the domain of perceptibles and, thus, to the realm of becoming, which conceals its nature as a mere image of true reality (“Becoming seems to be,” 165). “Being,” by contrast, “does not seem” (174); in other words, Platonic forms are not the kinds of things that “seem.” In order to make sense of this claim, one needs to bear in mind how the author explicates her notion of seeming: that an object “seems” means that (1) it “strikes us vividly and manifestly as being certain ways,” but (2) without “entail[ing] anything about how things really are” (162). Since forms don’t belong to the manifest world of perceptibles, they are not the kind of thing that “seems.” As for reflective attitudes that critically assess the appearances, but remain attached to the realm of becoming, they still qualify as doxa, if of a higher kind (pistis). Chapter 8 summarizes and adds further thoughts on the analogy of doxa with dreaming (R. 476c–d) and its atheoretical character. In her “Conclusion,” Moss discusses what motivates Plato’s epistemology. Her answer, in a nutshell, is that Plato’s emphasis on the separation between being and seeming and between the corresponding cognitive powers is linked to his overarching ethical goal: to find answers to the question of what is really (and not just apparently) good. His ethical agenda ultimately motivates his metaphysical epistemology.

I think that there is something fundamentally right about the Distinct Objects claim (and have advocated my own interpretation of it centered around Plato’s metaphysical-cum-epistemological notion of truth/true reality.) Moss provides a compelling argument for her version of the Distinct Objects claim, which will, for years to come, remain a very relevant contribution to the debate about Plato’s epistemology. Here, however, are six critical considerations:

(1) In her discussion of the defining objects of epistêmê and doxa (section 2.2), the author distinguishes between substantive and tautologous characterizations of the object of a cognitive power: For instance, the statement that the visible is the object of sight is tautologous, while the statement that color is the object provides substantive information. She also claims that substantive characterizations characterize the object independently of the corresponding power (63). It is, however, doubtful that any perceptual quality could be fully analyzed without reference to the corresponding perceptual power (which does not mean that their correlation is tautologous). We may refer to color (perhaps along with shape) as the formal object of sight, since a formal object is that which by definition, or essentially, is the object of a power. The distinctness of formal objects does not imply the distinctness of the underlying material objects. Thus, one and the same thing materially can be an object of sight and tactile perception. Accordingly, if being and seeming are the formal objects of epistêmê and doxa respectively, they might still relate to the same underlying objects since one and the same thing—e.g., an image—can be characterized by both being (viz., being an image) and seeming. Plato is, to be sure, committed to a separate realm of intelligibles, but the argument from the distinctness of the formal objects of epistêmê and doxa does not seem to be sufficient to establish this outcome. Did Plato really believe it was?

(2) When we look for statements in Plato that identify the (formal) object of epistêmê, we find passages that call it being or real being, others that characterize it as “the truth” ( alêtheia) or “that which is true” (ta alêthê) (e.g., R. 475e, 526b, Prm. 134a), and again others that link truth and being together (R. 508d, 525c). Moss acknowledges the close association of the notions of being and truth in the two-worlds dialogues, but focuses on the role of being. Yet statements like the one in the Simile of the Sun (R. 508d) strongly suggest that Plato’s ontological notion of alêtheia is an essential element in the formal characterization of the object of epistêmê. The label “being” (to on) is here applied to an object that, thanks to its ontological quality, is inherently accessible and transparent for the kind of cognitive power labeled epistêmê. In Plato, the word alêtheia and its cognates often designate not a quality of assertions, beliefs, or propositions, but a formal quality of intelligible forms.[1] As part of the formal characterization of the objects of epistêmê, it serves specifically to highlight the aspect of knowability or inherent transparency that links being to epistêmê. Is it not also qua domain of independently valid, rationally transparent truth that Plato accepts the forms as primary, self-subsistent reality?

(3) What about the characterization of the formal object of doxa as “seeming” or “appearing”? According to Moss, the “seeming” of the object of doxa means that it has no (real) being. It is also not a mere illusion (since Plato never claims that the world of perceptible bodies is a mere illusion). This idea of seeming as having an intermediate ontological status between being and utter non-being is not unproblematic. Take the example of the image of a bed, which recreates the appearance of a bed (R. 596a–598c). It is, of course, not a bed, but isn’t it still true that it is an image? Moss’s claim is primarily based on the semantics of the term doxa and its cognates, which can relate both to a state of mind and to the appearance or reputation of a thing or person. The Platonic texts, however, seem to suggest that what really distinguishes the sensible particulars from the intelligible form is a certain mode of appearance, viz., unstable, inaccurate, and conflicting appearance. Very telling in this respect is how Phaedo 74bc sets this kind of appearance in opposition to the stable and consistent mode of appearing characteristic of the form (cf. Moss 179 on this passage). In R. 479b–d, the mode of appearance of perceptible particulars is described as vacillation between being-thus and not-being-thus, preventing a firm cognitive hold (pagiôs noêsai).

(4) The Distinct Objects thesis, in the rigorous form defended by Moss, implies that there can be no doxa with respect to intelligible forms. A key problem here is how to describe the cognitive state of a person who has become aware of the difference between concrete instances and their universal intelligible form, is able to discuss the form, but does not yet have a secure epistemic grasp of it.—This is the condition the Socrates figure of Plato’s dialogues claims to be in. Moss addresses this issue in section 7.6, resorting to the notion of dianoia (roughly, “discursive thought”) in order to find a rubric in Plato’s conceptual framework for this level of cognition. This is a rather speculative move, as she admits, since Plato introduces this term in Republic 511a–d merely as a tentative label for mathematical thought. Mathematical thought is situated between epistêmê and doxa since it is directed at intelligible objects, but cannot fully comprehend their foundations and, to some extent, still relies on visual representations (diagrams). If we take the Distinct Objects thesis as seriously and rigidly as Moss asks us to, the cognitive power of dianoia in the Divided Line should correspond to a distinct ontological domain of mathematical objects ranking below forms and above material objects in the order of being and knowability.[2] What, then, does it mean when Socrates implies that he has only doxa regarding the form of the good (R. 506b–e)?[3] As others have observed (e.g., Verity Harte 2007), Plato seems to assume that language allows us to refer to an intelligible object via its “name” (onoma) even before we have a clear cognitive grasp of it. Doxastic judgments, as a form of internal speech (Tht. 189e–190a, Sph. 263e–264a, Phlb. 38b–39a), can be about an intelligible form even when the person does not yet have a firm epistemic grasp of it. Accordingly, and pace Moss, the intention of Plato’s Distinct Objects claim cannot be to restrict what we can refer to and make judgments about. It must relate solely to the underlying cognitive contact, which is an idea vividly expressed in the many tactile and visual metaphors Plato uses. Thus, if one happens to articulate a correct belief about an intelligible object such as justice, but from a cognitive condition that is as yet only familiar with putative instantiations of justice in the phenomenal world, it is still doxa. The prisoners in the Cave analogy see only such mere “shadows” of justice; and if a Socrates-like figure draws one of them into a debate about what justice is (R. 515d, 517a), what the interlocutor is able to “see” will initially still be confined to the Cave (the world of transient things and their appearances).

(5) What about the other part of the Distinct Objects thesis, the claim that there can be no epistêmê of perceptible particulars? Sometimes Plato seems to clearly endorse the possibility of evidence-based knowledge with respect to concrete objects or events (Men. 97a–b, Tht. 201a–c), but such examples might function merely as analogies informed by the idea that epistêmê requires direct cognitive contact. However, from what we have just said about epistemic judgements as grounded in firm cognitive contact with intelligible forms, shouldn’t we conclude that the person who has grasped the underlying intelligible form is also able to recognize and know which sensible objects truly have a share in this form and which don’t (R. 520c, cf. 484c–d)? To be sure, statements about such objects often need to be qualified appropriately with respect to time, aspect, comparison, etc.; but Plato is aware of it and sometimes explicitly describes how one can ensure the accurateness of an ascription by adding the necessary qualifications (R. 436b–437a, Prm. 129a–e). If we want to retain the core insight of the Distinct Objects thesis, we need to bear in mind that it is a claim about the different qualities of cognitive contact with an object of inquiry such that the quality of the cognition is a function of the ontological quality of the object the mind is in contact with. The primary aim of Plato’s philosophical method is to gain a correct understanding of important concepts in our language by elucidating the underlying intelligible forms. At the same time, he maintains a sharp distinction between the cognitive presence of a form and the application of such conceptual understanding to objects and situations in the phenomenal world, including our own lives and social environment (cf. Moss 122ff on expert rulers). The latter kind of object, because of the transient and perspectival nature of its being, doesn’t sustain a firm comprehensive grasp that would permanently elucidate it. Someone who knows the intelligible form speaks from a position of epistêmê about its particular instances, but cannot have epistêmê of them (cf. Ti. 37b).

(6) Does Plato’s ethics provide the ultimate motive for his metaphysical epistemology, as Moss argues in her “Conclusion,” referring to his concern with what is really, and not just apparently, good? If that were the ultimate motive, would it not be counterproductive to demote the ethical application of one’s understanding of the good to the status of doxa? While the quest for what is truly good certainly remains a central interest throughout his work, it does not explain the turn from the focus in the early dialogues on what it means to live a virtuous and happy life here and now to the contemplative and “other-worldly” orientation in his later dialogues beginning with the Phaedo. In Greek culture, the divide between the human and divine spheres was not absolute, as gods embodied an ideal form of happiness, and humans, in certain exceptional cases, could become divinized and attain this kind of happiness. It seems more likely that it was the discovery of a domain of intelligible truth populated by eternally perfect and inviolable beings, gradually accessible for human souls through the workings of reason, that steered Plato to his conception of happiness as contact with, and assimilation to, the divine intelligible world (homoiôsis theôi). If so, his metaphysical-cum-epistemological discoveries are what explains the changed course of his ethics.


Jan Szaif (2018). “Plato and Aristotle on Truth and Falsehood,” in Michael Glanzberg (ed.), The Oxford Handbook of Truth, Oxford University Press, 9–49.

Verity Harte (2007). “Language in the Cave,” in Dominic Scott (ed.), Maieusis, Oxford University Press, 195–215.

[1] Cf. Szaif, Platons Begriff der Wahrheit (Alber, 1996/98); idem, 2018.

[2] Mathematicals differ from Forms by their multipliability (e.g., the multiple squares referred to in a geometrical proof, as opposed to the unique “Square itself.”)

[3] Cf. p.187 for Moss’ reading of this passage.