Plato's Moral Psychology

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Rachana Kamtekar, Plato's Moral Psychology, Oxford University Press, 2017, 231pp., $55.00, ISBN 9780198798446.

Reviewed by A. W. Price, Birkbeck, University of London


Rachana Kamtekar has already won a niche for herself through a series of articles on Plato that are not only ingenious and original (as is now de rigueur, and often enough achieved), but also genuinely perceptive. This, her first book, pursues a seminal idea through a plurality of Platonic dialogues. An introduction helpfully highlights what is central and salient, and outlines what is to come; later résumés keep the reader on track. The result should enhance anyone's appreciation and enjoyment of these familiar yet elusive texts. (I shall spice the plainness of my summaries by some dissentient musings. These should prove that the book lacks any dormitive power, and should not be read as qualifying my appreciation of it. In the history of philosophy as in philosophy, things worth asserting are often worth denying.)

'No one does wrong willingly.' This, the most familiar of the Socratic paradoxes, is recurrent through Plato's writings on moral psychology. It is commonly construed in the context of the principle 'Virtue is knowledge', and glossed as attributing wrong action to ignorance. However, it survives a later recognition that virtue is not reducible to knowledge; and while ignorance of a kind may often be a precondition of acting badly, what makes this unwilling is not that precondition, but its frustration of a natural nisus, one towards one's own good. Kamtekar's appeal to this orientation is her Big Idea. Though not new (one already meets it in explanation of the paradox in Wolfgang Wieland's Platon und die Formen des Wissens, 1982), it is fruitful. She takes it to underlie even the multiple and variably rational desires of the Republic and Phaedrus: human psychology is complex in that it contains a variety of conceptions of the human good, all of them potentially motivating.

In the Protagoras, Socrates' argument with the common man makes room for the principle, characteristic of Plato's early moral psychology, that we always do what we believe to be the best of the things we can do (358b7-c1); it does this by refuting a vulgar opinion that denies that even knowledge of what is best guarantees its pursuit. Most men, Socrates concedes, suppose that knowledge is a slave who gets dragged about by passion, pleasure, pain, lust or fear (352b3-c2). Kamtekar interprets this in a striking way. She supposes, against Christopher Taylor, that pleasure operates here not as an intensional goal but as a magnetic force that operates causally upon the mind. Given at once the truth, and the agent's acceptance, of a hypothesis of ethical hedonism, we then get the nonsense that he knows, say, that x is more pleasant and therefore better than y (which entails, unlike mere belief, that it is so), and yet is led by a preponderance of pleasure to prefer y to x. This failure of the vulgar explanation opens the way to Socrates' own proposal that what causes the mischief is an appearance that y is pleasanter than x which misleads the agent who, lacking an art of measurement, falls short of knowing what is best.

This keeps close to the wording of 352b3-c2, but is not unproblematic. If the vulgar conceive of pleasures and pains as forces, nothing is easier than to add that the effective strength of a force is a function not only of its magnitude, but of its proximity; which should permit knowing that x will be pleasanter while succumbing to the immediate pleasure of y. However, one may wonder whether the model is only applicable to already present and operative pleasures and pains. Yet this cannot be Kamtekar's intention, and I guess that her thought may be rather -- which would also suit anger, love, and fear (b7-8) -- that the perception, sensory and non-conceptual, of a present pleasure may compete causally with the anticipation, similar in nature, either of a consequent pain or of an alternative pleasure, both in the future. But then it again becomes easy (think of Hume's view of ideas as less vivacious than impressions) to understand how y is liable to prevail. So, the vulgar are dubiously refuted -- which is, admittedly, what one may conclude on any interpretation.

Kamtekar then discusses the argument in the Gorgias that tyrants, far from being exceptionally able to do what they want, are the least able to do this. Here her central thesis applies clearly and centrally. She notes that Socrates shifts an assessment of the agent's power from what he can do and get away with, as compared with others, to whether he can effect his ends. The tyrant acts unwillingly, being unable to bring about what he really wants, since that is to achieve happiness or the human good; for, in a text that she often cites (Republic 505d5-9), when it comes to the good we all want the real thing. Socrates further argues that, if we distinguish means and ends, what the agent wants is not whatever he is doing, but that for the sake of which he is doing it (Gorgias 467d6-e1). This leads to the claim 'We don't want to kill, exile, and so on simpliciter; we want to do these things only if they are beneficial' -- which is how Kamtekar renders 468c2-4. She offers the following gloss (which I abbreviate): 'I want to do x only on the condition that doing x is a means to y (y being a good that I want) . . . under the condition that doing x is not a means to y or undermines y's coming-about, I don't want to do x' (85). Out of this comes a 'negative principle, to deattribute instrumental desires on the ground that they prevent, rather than bring about, the end for the sake of which the agent is acting' (86). Which brings Plato to an important distinction, quite absent from the Protagoras, between wanting and thinking best: the agent who is able to act as he thinks best will suppose, but may suppose wrongly, that he is able to do what he wants. He will then count as acting unwillingly, if not unwittingly.

A problem here is that, if we ascribe to the agent a desire to do x, if only given that x serves a real good y, we contradict 467d6-e1, which denies that a means can become itself an object of desire. A solution is to make a distinction of scope: it is not that, so long as x subserves y, the agent wants to do x, but that he wants (to do x if x subserves y) -- which is a complex desire with a conditional content that does not permit the detachment of 'He wants to do x' by 'x subserves y.' Moreover, the 'only' within Kamtekar's version of 468c3-4 is a surreptitious addition to what actually runs 'if these things are beneficial, we want to do them.' Unless we place the condition within the scope of the wish (which the order of clauses neither indicates nor excludes -- compare a casual 'But if it'll be a nuisance, I don't want to trouble you'), this incurs the further objection that the agent may not know whether x subserves y or not, in which case no fact of the matter could give him a desire to do x, even if there were such desires. Even without wanting to do x, he may still -- whether he knows, or believes, or just hopes that x subserves y -- do x for the sake of y. We may take Plato to be aware of all this, and then there are no categorical desires for means to be 'deattributed'.

That chapter ends with admirably succinct and lucid discussions of related material in Plato's Laws and Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics. There follows a fertile treatment of the Republic which finds a middle way between traditionalists and revisionists: the former are right to suppose that a man can act contrary to his own best judgement (as is illustrated by Leontius), but the latter are right to maintain that even spirit and appetite are oriented towards the human good, though they mistake its character. What soul-partition makes evident is that desires that are misdirected are still ours, and so resist deattribution; we should not, as in the vulgar conception rejected in the Protagoras, think of their causes as powers that are external to us. There is a danger of subdivision, whereby the principle of non-contrariety might cause trouble even within appetite itself; but then appetite is dubiously unified anyway -- we may think of the beast with many heads to which it is likened in Book 9. (Kamtekar does not discuss the possibilities of conflict within spirit, say between shame and one-upmanship.) It is an open question whether appetite is capable of reasoning of a kind: this might help explain how it comes to love money, but it may suffice that it has memories of money's utility in the past. Appetites are a kind of non-instrumental desire. Yet one may ask what guides a man in adopting means towards an appetitive end that his reason disavows. If appetite can't, and reason won't, reason instrumentally, this would seem to be an impasse -- which isn't what we are told of Leontius. We should not deattribute misdirected appetites on the ground that acting on an appetite is not always beneficial; and desiring every and any pleasure is characteristic not of appetite itself, but of the subject who has allowed appetite to become his master. Part of the utility of soul-parts, as is explicit in the Timaeus, is that reason can delegate certain tasks to them. Even appetite is set up, by the gods, so as to achieve some good.

One may then wonder what is the need, or substance, of supposing that all appetites, even a physiologically generated hunger or thirst that has been given a direction by memories of past replenishments, manifest a conception of the good; for it may be that they rather serve than seek the good. We may if we wish read an ambiguous sentence at 505d11-e1 as asserting that the soul seeks the good in all it does. Yet what is said of the soul may not be true of each part, and we may generally envisage, very much as Kamtekar proposes, that a soul which allows appetite a loose rein is delegating its own pursuit of the good to an agency that has its own final goals but thereby, in general, subserves the good of the whole. This will often be plausible -- even if it fails to apply to the case of Leontius. It allows action on appetite to be unproblematically willing on the part of appetite, just so long as it achieves the final goal of appetite, which will usually (though perhaps not always) be pleasure. It thus perfectly fits the Republic's qualified restatement of the thesis that vicious action is involuntary: 'The soul which is ruled by a tyrant will be least able to do what it wants -- at any rate if we are talking about the entire soul' (577d13-e1).

A shorter chapter that follows is really an appendix on the role of spirit. Kamtekar takes it to be Plato's view in the Republic that spirit may be reproved by reason, as within the soul of Odysseus, but never opposes reason in alliance with appetite. (Here she accepts without qualification a statement at 440b4-7 that Shorey took to be 'to literal understanding an exaggeration'. On this conception, a spirit chastised by reason always offers the other cheek; cf. hekonta, Phaedrus 254c2.) Plato shifts in the Timaeus to a denial that appetite is a subject of belief, perhaps after reflections in the Theaetetus that Kamtekar relates to the non-sensory character of the propositional nexus. There, even spirit can only receive reason's reports in the form of images.

This last suggestion overlooks that spirit is placed in the human body close to the head 'in order that it may overhear the logos' (Timaeus 70a2-5). A less significant query attaches to Kamtekar's reading of Phaedrus 254b4-c2, which is intelligibly motivated but hard to think through. There we read that the susceptible lover who gets too close to the boy but thereby glimpses the Forms 'in sudden reverence falls on his back, and is forced at the same time to pull back the reins so violently as to bring both horses [spirit as well as appetite] down on their haunches' (tr. Rowe). Kamtekar takes it that, while the falling back is involuntary, and necessitated by an abrupt recollection of Beauty, the pulling back is deliberate and salutary. Yet such a simultaneous combination of the voluntary and involuntary would seem to require an astonishing presence of mind. We may prefer to note two things: the lover is rather being 'forced at the same time to pull back the reins' than making the best of falling back; and his spontaneously inhibiting vision was as much of Moderation as of Beauty.

In her final chapter, Kamtekar grants two things: an action appears intelligible when we see how it appears best to the agent; and soul-parts are presented as quasi-agents each (in her view) pursuing the good according to its own notions. Yet these claims have not turned out to be fundamental; for underlying them is a conception of a good that is the natural object of desire, with its corollary that vice and wrongdoing are unwilling. She even suggests that seeing how an action appears from the agent's point of view risks infection by his mistakes, and so can be as dangerous as sympathizing with the erroneous emotions of a tragic hero. (Or may it rather reassure us that the second owes a special seductiveness to its aesthetic trappings? Cf. the mixed pleasure and pain of Philebus 48a5-9?) Appeal to intelligence, whether human or divine, is more explanatory than the mere positing of Forms as formal causes; taken together, these rescue us from the paradoxes that come, in the Phaedo, of taking material factors to be more than necessary conditions. (One is reminded of David Wiggins's conception of Forms as determinations of the good that feed into a cosmic teleology.) Even bad actions may be accommodable as side-effects of the good. In the Symposium, the lover is motivated by a lack that must be real, and what he fills it with must be really good: 'Our reality-oriented desire for good makes our beliefs about good and bad particularly reality-responsive . . . Evidence that one's conception of the good is false will motivate belief-change' (202). It becomes apparent, on this conception, that the lover's ascent is owed less to the contingencies of a temperament or of a guide than to the necessary aspirations of desire.

A short review can do limited justice to what I have found to be a general truth: Rachana Kamtekar is unable to touch on any topic without having something to say about it that is at least interesting and at best illuminating.