Plato's Threefold City and Soul

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Joshua I. Weinstein, Plato's Threefold City and Soul, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 292pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107170162.

Reviewed by Roslyn Weiss, Lehigh University


In this astutely written, thoughtful, and stimulating book, Joshua Weinstein makes the case for the indispensability of the third, thumotic (spirited) part of the city and soul to the attainment of political and psychic justice. Offering a rich and deep analysis of (mainly) the human soul and the essential place in it of an element distinct from both reason and appetite, the book tracks this tripartition as it develops through three separate and sequential arguments: the argument from diversity of character, the argument from opposition of motivation, and the argument from sufficiency of function. It further explains how and why the city-soul analogy is vital in advancing the cause of tripartition in the soul.

The book contains three parts. The first is devoted to the first two arguments for tripartition, namely, the arguments from character and from opposition; the second, to the third tripartition argument, the argument from function; and the third, to a full treatment of the work of thumos. In Part I Weinstein shows that "observational anthropology" (43) yields three basic character-types: the wisdom and knowledge-loving, the victory and honor-loving, and the profit and pleasure-loving. Weinstein then explains why there are not more than three basic types -- in particular, why further division into male and female is not helpful, and why two of the five character-types discussed in Books 8 and 9, namely, the democratic and tyrannic, do not "define specific characters . . . [since] they lack identifiable expressions at the shorter time-scales" (51). Weinstein next turns to the argument from opposition, contending that it is not intended to stand alone but rather relies on the three character-types already identified: "The three oppositions that appear in book four Socrates takes to represent the three main possibilities open to us when we choose how to live our lives: the life of acquisition, the life of ambition and the life of curiosity" (10). He then goes on to discuss the argument from opposition at great length and with much care.

In Part II Weinstein directs his attention to the three needs that a city must satisfy if it is to be self-sufficient ("autarkic"), namely, sustenance, defense, and guidance. He follows Socrates' imagined city as it proceeds from its initial healthy state to a feverish one and finally to a state of self-sufficiency that exhibits justice (112-13). Justice as conceived on this large scale can then be transferred to the smaller scale, the individual soul: once Socrates constructs a city that addresses its three needs, non-isolated individuals are seen to have the same needs and to require souls designed to address them. In Part III Weinstein focuses on the work thumos performs. In this "rather speculative" part (235) Weinstein looks to Homer to help account for how thumos, whose essential role is that of "preserver," is unified, that is, how it encompasses, as preserver, love of victory (philonikia) and love of honor (philotimia), as well as other phenomena regularly associated with it, such as anger, shame, resentment, and ambition.

There is much to admire in Weinstein's book. The following are several points meant to encourage further reflection. The first is methodological. In the book little attention is paid to the drama, to the characters, or to how the nature, needs, and limitations of Socrates' interlocutors affect his strategy. The possibility is nowhere entertained that, for example, an argument with Thrasymachus might best be taken with a grain of salt precisely because it is an argument with Thrasymachus. In discussing the shift from the healthy to the feverish city, Weinstein does not ask why Adeimantus is satisfied with the crude and spare first city and why Glaucon is not, why there are only "some" who find the "economic city" insufficient (373a1), and why Glaucon is among that "some." Indeed, Weinstein treats the disastrous turn to luxury as inevitable, attributable to a "lacuna" in the economic city, that is, to its lack of self-awareness, its failure to appreciate its own self-sufficiency (106-107), when, dramatically, the turn is due to Glaucon's insistence on a city that contains finery. It would seem, then, that, contra Weinstein (159), it is not the threat of starvation that is the cause of war but rather Glaucon's sophisticated tastes: despite what Socrates sees as the economic city's sufficiency (373d), to Glaucon the first city is a city of sows, one wholly inadequate for men of his cultivation (373d).

Although Weinstein occasionally detects humor in the text, as, for example, in the case of "philosophic dogs," even recognizing irony here -- "love of learning . . . incorporates a higher level of dynamism, and welcomes not just that which is already known . . . but also and especially the unknown" (172) -- he will not go so far as to deny all seriousness to the idea that dogs are philosophic; instead, he gravely grants them the ability to distinguish friend from enemy by the criterion of familiarity aided by memory. Another similar instance is the final argument in Book 1, where Weinstein acknowledges "ambiguity" (111) but not risible fallaciousness. Socrates argues that since the function of the soul is to live, the virtue of the soul, justice, is what enables it to "live well." Of course, living is the function of the soul only in the sense that the soul makes and keeps a body alive. In this sense of living, a strong heart and capacious lungs would better equip one to "live well" than would justice. And in this sense, all souls -- not just human souls -- perform the function of living. Socrates conveniently overlooks the specifically human functions of the soul that he himself mentions -- managing, ruling, and deliberating -- for these do not help him make the point that it is justice that ensures human happiness or "living well."

A second concern involves Weinstein's analysis of the second of Socrates' arguments, the argument from opposition. I find interesting and reasonable Weinstein's presentation of the first argument, the argument from character, in which he claims that the specific number and variety of characters posited are "a directly observable fact" (49). And I also find persuasive Weinstein's contention that tripartition relies not solely on the argument from opposition but derives support from the character argument (Weinstein cites 435e-436b in this regard [41]). Yet Weinstein appears to concur with the widespread judgment that the opposition argument on its own is weak. This derogation arises, in my view, from the mistaken assumption that (the Socratic version of) the principle of noncontradiction that establishes the distinction between reason and appetite is at work as well in proving that appetite and thumos are distinct and so, too, thumos and reason (even though Socrates never says so). Indeed, once the principle of noncontradiction when applied to appetite and reason definitively demonstrates that the soul does not act "as a whole" (436b1), the only question left is whether there is a third part distinct from the other two: is thumos separate from appetite and, if so, is it separate also from reason? Commentators, including Weinstein, fail to realize that in the Leontius example, it is reason and appetite that are "at faction" (440b) -- not thumos and appetite. As reason and appetite struggle with each other, reason causes Leontius to be disgusted, turn away, and cover his face. It is only when appetite triumphs over reason that Leontius scolds his eyes: it is here that we witness thumos in action, siding with reason (which has tried and failed to pull Leontius away from the corpses) against appetite (which has successfully drawn him to them). This case is essentially no different from that in which one is drawn to drink by appetite yet drawn away from drinking by reason; the only new element here is thumos, which does not enter the scene, however, until after the struggle has ended. Since the struggle Leontius experiences is not between his appetite and his thumos, it is hardly surprising that it is not the principle of noncontradiction to which Socrates appeals in distinguishing these two soul-parts from one another. (Weinstein does raise in a note [n. 49 (86-87)] the question of reason's role in the "confrontation" that he takes to be between thumos and appetite, but he chooses to "remain agnostic on the matter" since, as he says, "the argument proceeds perfectly well without reference to reason." The fact is, however, that at 440b3 reason, "logos," is explicitly named as one of the two parties at faction, indeed as the one with which thumos allies itself.)

In order to show that thumos is distinct from reason, two "proofs" are offered, neither of which involves the principle of noncontradiction. The first proof, offered by Glaucon and reinforced by Socrates, is that thumos can be found in beings that have no reason -- either not yet (as in the case of children) or not ever (as in the case of animals). The second proof relies on a quote from Homer (Odyssey xx, 17-18), in which Odysseus's reason berates his irrational thumos and dissuades it from immediately exacting revenge. To my knowledge, commentators have failed to notice that the Odyssey scenario is precisely the one that had just been described at 440c: "And what about when a man believes he's being done injustice? Doesn't his spirit in this case boil and become harsh and form an alliance for battle with what seems just . . . [unless] it becomes gentle, having been called in by the reason within him like a dog by a herdsman?" In the Odysseus illustration, reason is the shepherd that reins in the dog thumos when it boils as a result of believing it has suffered injustice. The Odysseus passage shows not that reason and thumos pull in opposite directions but that thumos is distinct from reason insofar as reason can stand in relation to it as herdsman to dog. It would seem that thumos is a swing-vote: in a non-corrupt soul (441a), it will vote with reason against appetite (440e) and be obedient to it (440d6); in a corrupt soul it will (by implication) team up with appetite. Socrates in fact signals thumos's dual status by regarding it sometimes as one of two ruling parts (442a-b) and at other times as one of two ruled ([442c11]).

Third, Weinstein -- perhaps influenced by Penner and his notion of "diachronic belief akrasia" (21, n. 31) -- assigns to thumos in its role as preserver of the function of shoring up reason's beliefs when they have been, or are in danger of being, temporarily dislodged by the onset of appetite: "We see the need for thumos most clearly when we consider the vacillations and rationalizations to which reason would be prone if left to confront sensory pain and pleasure unassisted" (24). I see no grounds in the text of the Republic for the idea that reason, left unprotected, becomes "compromised" by the appetites so that it vacillates and rationalizes (270). There is, of course, every indication that appetite, the biggest part of the soul, can overcome little reason, particularly if thumos, lacking or failing to exercise its virtue of andreia, does not come to reason's aid, but I find no mention of rationalization -- indeed, no mention of reason yielding its beliefs (even temporarily) even in defeat. (At 412-414 it is not reason but thumos that gives up its views involuntarily.) Note that, contra Weinstein (77), when Book 8's oligarchic man enslaves his reason to his appetite for money, his reason does not change its beliefs; at most, oligarchic man can force reason to work for its nemesis, appetite. (By contrast, thumos is made to come around to appetite's way of thinking; it is not permitted to "admire and honor anything but wealth and the wealthy, while loving the enjoyment of no other honor than that resulting from the possession of money and anything that happens to contribute to getting it" [553d].) When thumos functions properly it stands firm, adhering through thick and thin to the beliefs bequeathed to it by reason, including the belief that it must put the interests of the whole first. Its job description, however, does not include keeping reason from wavering. (There are similarly no grounds for the view that in the Protagoras argument at 356c-357b reason temporarily loses its grip as pleasure comes near, and then subsequently regains it. On the contrary, when pleasure and the good are the same -- a critical feature of this argument that goes unacknowledged by Weinstein and others -- all that remains is correct and incorrect calculation. The distortion in the appearance of the size of a pleasure or pain caused by its nearness fools those who lack the relevant calculus but not those who have it. Since all people seek the actually larger pleasure/good, regret is indeed felt after the wrong choice is made -- not, however, because one has allowed one's reason to lapse as one has pursued pleasure but because one has made the poorer choice among available pleasures: one has taken less pleasure/good when more was possible.)

A fourth point, related to the first, methodological, point, is that in his extensive consideration of philonikia and philotimia, Weinstein fails to mention that Adeimantus attributes philonikia to his brother Glaucon (548d), just as Thrasymachus had done earlier with respect to Socrates (336c) (and as Callicles does, also with respect to Socrates, in the Gorgias at 515b). These are not compliments. Nor is philotimia highly regarded: Socrates says at 347b that the best and most decent men are not "lovers of honor." Whereas for Weinstein both these traits are generally stabilizing and therefore admirable -- for him philotimia turns sour only as it slides into hubris (250) -- in the Republic and elsewhere in Plato they are pejoratively tinged.

Finally, the elephant in the room is the matter of whether optimal coordinated functionality has anything to do with justice. To his credit Weinstein indeed flags the problem -- "To say of a person that one steals things which do not belong to one (and is hence unjust) simply is not the same as saying that one suffers from dissension inside the soul" (112) -- but he nevertheless proceeds to treat justice as internal integrity, whether in city or in soul. Weinstein describes justice (which he pairs seamlessly with well-being) as a "positive condition." For a polity to be "happy, successful [and] prosperous," he says, each of the elements must not only refrain from meddling with the others; each must "do its own," must carry out that to which it is best suited. So, too, in the individual, where justice in the soul is that state in which parts "do their own," that is, in which there is "the productive engagement and integration of one's capacities" (9). Yet surely it is telling that the economic city is not pronounced just -- it is called only "true" and "healthy" [372e] -- even though it epitomizes the ideal of "doing one's own." Perhaps when Weinstein declares that "cold calculations of rational self-interest . . . undergird the political community and its justice" (117), he takes Socrates too much at his word. For, we must wonder, where in all these cold calculations are the soul's dispositions not to harm other people, to have respect for them and what is theirs, and, yes, in some cases, even to care for and help them? In the final analysis, the just man must be, not only from our perspective but from Socrates' as well (331c, 335d-e, 342e), at a minimum one who neither harms others nor wishes to, and maximally mankind's greatest benefactor.