Play as Symbol of the World and Other Writings

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Eugen Fink, Play as Symbol of the World and Other Writings, Ian Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner (trs.), Indiana University Press, 2016, 349pp., $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780253021052.

Reviewed by Stuart Elden, University of Warwick


Eugen Fink (1905-1975) is not sufficiently well known in the Anglophone world, in part because of the lack of translations of his work. He is perhaps generally understood through two texts which have been translated -- his continuation of Edmund Husserl's work in the Sixth Cartesian Meditation and his co-taught Heraclitus Seminar with Martin Heidegger. As one of Husserl's assistants, his work was initially seen as a continuation of his ideas; and towards the end of his career the Heidegger relation tends to dominate readings. Ronald Bruzina's Edmund Husserl & Eugen Fink: Beginnings and Ends in Phenomenology 1928-1938 (Yale University Press, 2004) is an excellent guide to his philosophical apprenticeship. Yet Fink was a significant thinker in his own right, with a number of important works on phenomenology, metaphysics, Nietzsche, the world, death and education published in his lifetime. Of these, only the Nietzsche book was previously available in English. Since his death a number of other volumes have appeared, some based on his lecture courses. His Gesamtausgabe or collected edition, under the general editorship of Stephan Grätzel, Cathrin Nielsen and Hans Rainer Sepp, has been underway since 2006, with five volumes published to date.

One of those volumes is the text translated here. The key text included is the 1960 book Spiel als Weltsymbol, from which the volume takes its title. This is perhaps his most important and enduring work, and the translators rightly call it his 'magnum opus' (p. 1). The German editors include essays preceding and succeeding the book on related topics, and a number of shorter and fragmentary writings on the theme. The most important is the 1957 essay 'Oasis of Happiness: Thoughts toward an Ontology of Play'. This has been translated before, including by this volume's translators, but the version included here is a revised version, and its importance in anticipating the book's argument is indisputable. The German Editors' Afterword and apparatus is also translated, and the translators have included their own Introduction as well as helpful bibliographies of primary texts by Fink and secondary literature on him in English. The book is produced to a high standard, though a more extensive index than the name list provided would have been helpful.

The inspiration for the whole work can perhaps be found in Heraclitus's fragment which declares that aion, which Fink renders as Weltlauf, 'course of the world', is 'like a child playing a game' (i.e. p. 51). The game, or play -- Spiel -- is the theme throughout this work, though regularly related back to the world, and the human-world relation. As he states, "Our question concerning play is led by a fundamental philosophical problem. This problem is the relation between the human being and the world" (p. 80). Fink's mode of operating in this work is to think about the question of play in relation to myth, ritual and philosophy. Along the way, he discusses sport, cults, theatre and theology, among other themes. He makes a clear case that play has been neglected as a philosophical topic, and seen as trivial. He insists on its fundamental nature and its parallel importance to other topics: "Play has an extraordinary status in its being an existential basic phenomenon, just as primordial as mortality, love, work, and struggle" (p. 204). He suggests that it has tended to be devalued by the tradition as mimesis, as imitation or copy. Fink thus thinks about play from multiple perspectives, from the play of children to the play of the world, which he characterizes as 'a game without a player' (p. 206).

Chapter Four has long been the one from which I have drawn most inspiration, because here Fink moves from the analysis of play to 'The Worldliness of Human Play'. As he suggested earlier in the work:

Precisely as a human problem, human play is worldly -- and as a worldly problem it points to the human being. The relationship between the human being and world cannot be adequately thought on the model of the relation between two things, two beings (p. 46).

To understand play we must understand the world, and to understand the world as play we gain insight into the world. Play, despite its importance, is subordinate to that wider philosophical project. Fink accepts that the history of Western metaphysics has long treated the problem of the world, but he makes the argument that this has been in a way that pluralizes it, "a title for realms of Being, for dimensions of different things" (p. 192). Fink is attempting to grasp a broader question, which he claims has been lost by these previous approaches. He is interested in the phenomena of being-worldly, the situation of being-in-the-world. This opens up questions of the totality, das All, of universality, Allgemeinheit (p. 194). But this does not mean that the world is simply "an external framework around things, not a container in which they occur -- like potatoes in a sack or jewels in a safe" (p. 196). This is an argument which he shares with Husserl and Heidegger, and has important resonances for how we understand the world in relation to space and time, and as a challenge to Cartesian-Newtonian systems. Fink contends that

The human being's position in the world is not an objective location in a space understood as a homogeneous system of positions, is not an extent of time in a constant manifold of extensions, is neither specifiable by the proximity to certain things nor by a fixed distance from a highest being, and thus does not signify any location in a hierarchy or graded architecture of all things (p. 61).

Fink proposes four ways of thinking the concept of worldliness: first as a characteristic of all beings and events, their intraworldliness; worldly in the second sense is the "prevailing of the world itself", the totality of being as such; third as an essential, fundamental comportment of the human being, in their existence, in which their worldliness is more than other things; and finally as the mortal aspect of human life, compared to the eternal, the sensual, not the spiritual (pp. 198-200). In the third of these Fink makes a distinction which draws on Heidegger's 1929-30 lecture course The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics, suggesting that the human is more worldly than a stone, tree or animal. Fink attended this course, and encouraged Heidegger to publish it. The resulting volume, shortly after Fink's death, was dedicated to him by Heidegger. Play does not relate to all of these ways of thinking the world in the same way, and he explicitly rules out the second as being akin to human play (p. 202). But the first, third and fourth are ones to which the problem of play gives particular access. It is therefore the rationale for the detailed treatment which Fink provides.

Compared to Husserl and Heidegger, Fink is a much more readable writer, and the translators have done an excellent job of rendering his words into fluid English prose. They often provide German terms or phrases within brackets in the text, but not so much that the reading experience is encumbered by it. One choice seems a bit archaic -- capitalizing 'Being' for das Sein has long been seen as problematic and avoidable. But generally what faults there are lie with Fink, not his translators. While many sentences contain powerful thoughts, his overall argument can be difficult to follow. He is digressive, illustrative and cumulative, rather than systematic or sequential in his approach to the questions. The additional texts -- some published by Fink, others more note-form -- add to the main discussion, supplementing or elaborating some points. His 1954 course outline on 'The Philosophical-Pedagogical Problem of Play' offered a useful insight into the genesis of his ideas, while some of the later texts are recapitulations of the themes. Not all of the essays add that much, but it is good to see a complete translation of the Gesamtausgabe volume, rather than a partial one which would leave other texts orphaned.

The Translators' Introduction provides a very valuable overview of Fink's work, as a primer for Anglophone audiences, and works well with the German Editor's Afterword, which is a more specific analysis of the role of play in his work. Among other themes, the translators touch on the difficulties Fink faced in the Third Reich because of his continued association with Husserl. After Husserl's death in 1938, Fink helped to move his manuscripts to Leuven in Belgium. The Introduction provides some harrowing detail of his arrest and incarceration in a concentration camp. After the war he received his Habilitation for the Sixth Cartesian Meditation. Heidegger was asked to provide an assessment, but simply said that as it was authorized by Husserl it therefore needed "no further attestation". As the translators note, this has led to persistent claims that Heidegger directed Fink's Habitationschrift. Fink was offered, but declined, the chair at Freiburg which both Husserl and Heidegger had held. What is perhaps more astonishing is that following his experience with Husserl, and in the war, he would chose to work with Heidegger at all. There were multiple meetings culminating in the 1966-67 seminar on Heraclitus.

Fink's works have been discussed by a wide range of people, including Jacques Derrida, Gilles Deleuze, Emmanuel Levinas, David Farrell Krell and Françoise Dastur. His influence on Greek-French philosopher Kostas Axelos is incalculable, especially in Axelos's own masterwork Le jeu du monde [the play, or game of the world]. Axelos had Play as Symbol of the World translated for his Arguments series in France in 1966, along with two other works by Fink. Through Axelos, Fink would become important to Henri Lefebvre, whose own reflections on the world took a more explicitly political turn. Fink is a crucial thinker in the question of the process of becoming world, the term mondialisation which Lefebvre and Axelos distinguish from the Anglophone 'globalisation'. This long overdue translation -- there were reports of a forthcoming translation back in the early 1970s -- should make his ideas much more widely available. The translators rightly note that "the writings collected here constitute the most intensive and comprehensive philosophical engagement with play in the twentieth century" (p. 1). It is also a significant contribution to debates about symbols and the world. Indiana University Press, Ian Alexander Moore and Christopher Turner have done Anglophone readers a great service.