Pleasure and the Good Life: Concerning the Nature, Varieties, and Plausibility of Hedonism

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Feldman, Fred, Pleasure and the Good Life: Concerning the Nature, Varieties, and Plausibility of Hedonism, Oxford University Press, 2004, 221pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 019926516X.

Reviewed by Leonard D. Katz, Massachusetts Institute of Technology


Hedonism, taken as a theoretical approach to life's value, says that a life is intrinsically or ultimately good or worthwhile according to and on account of the pleasure less the pain, or suffering, it contains. Fred Feldman begins in roughly this place and then proceeds to formulate a whole family of 'hedonisms' designed to be immune to moralists' various objections, until finally we are treated to 'hedonisms' that are close extensional equivalents to even such paradigmatically anti-hedonistic views as G.E. Moore's. For all the acute, ingenious, and concise disposal of many objections to hedonism that fill much of this clearly written, accessible, and often rewarding book, anyone who regards pleasure as ever an ultimate and unmediated value-maker, if only within some component of a pluralist value theory, will sense long before its end that this original guiding idea of hedonism has been left behind along the way. While Feldman's 'basic intrinsic value states' are all 'hedonistic' in that they include pleasure or pain, these need not be taken at their hedonic face value, since this may be 'adjusted' as various normative standards, such as the appropriateness of the pleasure or pain as a response to its object, may demand. Old-style hedonism's intensity and duration of pleasure and pain are thus supplemented by extra dimensions as needed to yield value theories that satisfy the various objectors. This strategy of reconciling hedonism with its opponents follows the pattern of Mill's privileging of culturally 'higher' pleasures. Feldman defends Mill's and his own use of extra dimensions of value against Moore's charge, that this strategy actually abandons hedonism for value pluralism, by insisting that all 'basic intrinsic value states' in the resulting views are still pleasures and pains. However, the deeper worry that such views abandon hedonism's guiding idea that life is ultimately better by, and only by, containing more pleasure or less pain is never satisfactorily addressed, but seemingly defined away (177-81), despite an earlier concession that these views use nonhedonic normative standards in determining value (121). Moreover, when subjects' desert of pleasure and pain is allowed to similarly adjust hedonic states' contribution to the value of worlds (although not of lives), the historical hedonists' insistence that the value of larger wholes supervenes on that of the individual lives they contain is jettisoned as well. And this, unlike the earlier adjustment of pleasure's and pain's value within lives, is not merely offered to objectors but is proposed in our author's own voice.

While Feldman presents this progress from face-value to variously adjusted evaluations of hedonic episodes mainly as response to various normative objections to old-style hedonism, it may be more internally motivated and defended along lines opened by his earlier move from a feeling to an attitude view of pleasure. For while feelings of pleasure and pain may be supposed Humean particulars good or bad in their isolable selves, attitudes are relational and essentially directed on their objects. If pleasure and pain are essentially evaluative reactions to their objects, they may be evaluated by their objects' independent values or for their correctness in tracking these, rather than solely from the subject's side. Such appraisal, however, seems alien to the hedonistic tradition Feldman claims to represent.

Feldman's own route to revising this tradition begins by following Sidgwick in taking introspection to rule out pleasure's consisting in any distinctive kind of feeling (79 & his earlier "Two Questions about Pleasure", cited there; 85n5), by which Feldman apparently means bodily feeling of some sensory kind (56). That he is an ethicist, writing largely in response to discussions by ethicists, rather than by recent philosophers of mind, shows here, and leads him to run the risk of appearing to ridicule a mere straw man. Even someone who regards pleasure and pain as representing internal bodily states should distinguish such 'hot' affective feeling from garden-variety sensation. Still the doubt about there being any distinctive individuating quale (however affective rather than sensory) would remain. 'Sensory hedonism', we are told, is therefore unsatisfactory as an account of the unity of pleasure. But if no distinctive sensation is always present when pleasure is, we are assured (taking the other side of what is often supposed an exhaustive dichotomy) that a special intrinsic-value-bearing propositional attitude of taking pleasure in something is. It is in terms of this 'attitudinal pleasure' that Feldman formulates his hedonism about life's value; sensory pleasures and pains, in contrast, are neither bearers of intrinsic value nor are they essentially pleasures or pains of any kind, but they are contingently made sensory pleasures or pains as their subject takes attitudinal pleasure or pain at the time in the fact of their occurrence. Thus both the seeming unity of pleasure and suffering and their apparent diversity are elegantly handled, the former by positing two unitary propositional attitudes and the latter by the diversity of their contingent objects (79-80 & "Two Questions"). It is the intensity with which these attitudes are held, not that of any qualitative sensation, that matters for our good or ill. This account allows us to count as hedonically good a life lived without sensory pleasure by someone of 'Stoic' tastes who takes attitudinal pleasure in this. And Epicurean 'static pleasure' may be understood as attitudinal pleasure toward the absence of [sensory?] pain and disturbance [attitudinal pain?] (97ff.). (But a causal role for this attitude in producing a nonattitudinal static pleasure would work at least as well as an interpretation. And that this absence by itself during life suffices for the greatest sustainable pleasure, by excluding the only possible impediments to life's inherent nonattitudinal pleasure, may be still closer to Epicurus' actual view.)

Since there is surely something right about placing the affects of pleasure and pain more on the reactive than on the stimulus side of the mind, Feldman seems right in identifying these with ways we take things, rather than with experiences we might react to in either way on different occasions, if these are the only options between which we must choose. However, the suggested analogy with the likes of [occurrent rather than standing?] belief fails to hold with any generality. We can believe, hope, or fear propositions regarding others as much as ones regarding ourselves and what happens at remote as well as at present or close times. We similarly can take pleasure in others' successes and in facts about remote times. If enjoying a sensation is (as Feldman suggests) having this same attitude toward the fact of its occurrence, why can we not enjoy others' sensations or suffer others' pains, if not as much as our own, then even a little, along with temporally remote sensations of our own? While using oneself-now-centered propositions working like de se self-attributions (as Feldman's earlier work suggests) may motivate some degree of self- and present-centeredness, and considerations about vividness of representation and singular reference may help more, it is not clear that such resources are sufficient to address the tensions in Feldman's uniform attitude view--tensions caused by his assimilation of pleasure in sensory and bodily activity to thought-mediated pleasure, which two the medieval intentionalist tradition he remotely follows (by way of Brentano and Chisholm) had generally handled in different ways.

A line of thought going back to Anscombe ("On the Grammar of 'Enjoy'", The Journal of Philosophy, 64, 1967; repr. in Collected Philosophical Papers, Vol. II) poses a more general problem for such single-propositional-attitude views of all pleasure and enjoyment. Finding pleasure in an activity is not the same thing as taking pleasure in the fact that it occurs; indeed, we often do the one without the other. Following Anscombe's example of riding: one may fail to enjoy exercising while simultaneously taking pleasure in the fact that this very exercising occurs. But these seem, respectively, not-having and having the same token attitude, attitudinal pleasure then toward the same fact, on Feldman's view. Such examples show that what Feldman counts as the same, enjoying an activity and enjoying the fact of its occurrence, are different. Only the latter, as Anscombe points out, do we ordinarily call taking pleasure in a fact. If we are to distinguish the two by saying that this second pleasure is to be understood as enjoying the further fact that we are contemplating the first fact, we violate our intuitive sense of what the content is of our taking pleasure in (as we say and think) the fact that we are exercising. But Feldman relies on the ordinary sense in which we take pleasure in something and know that we do to motivate his view (56).

Feldman often writes loosely, not only of propositions, facts, and states of affairs (which may seem close enough) but also of sensations as among attitudinal pleasure's objects. This would relocate the tension into doubt whether any single attitude can have such logically diverse objects. But his official view assimilates sensations and activities to the [centered?] propositions of their occurrence. It would seem better to discriminate Anscombe's absent pleasure in riding from her actual pleasure in the fact of her riding through the different activities of riding and thinking, as Aristotle and the Scholastics might, thus counting the envisioning of a state of affairs as among the many activities that may be enjoyed, rather than as the general case. The intentionality of pleasure might, most parsimoniously, be made derivative on that of such activities or acts, some of which clearly have objects but some perhaps not. But even if pleasure always depends on some single attitude (perhaps toward these activities), we might still doubt along with Ockham that pleasure need always accompany this, as in his example of someone deeply depressed.

Most importantly, it cannot be assumed that in cases of apparently objectless mood an intentional object always lurks concealed. Perhaps it does; but, then, perhaps a phenomenally conscious but not easily examined feeling may as well (or instead), and this, rather, is or unifies pleasure, as in the view that Feldman, following Sidgwick on introspectionist grounds, rejects. (Perhaps pleasure is often or always inseparable from its function of directing our attention toward other things but away from itself.) Psychologists who study mood regard it, as does common sense, as often objectless--and also regard our baseline affect as a major factor in our affective well-being. Perhaps some philosopher taking a very narrow view of pleasure, as including only short-term responses to those stimuli we call "pleasures", can reject these as outside his purview. But Feldman, who intends to give an account of all well-being, clearly cannot. (Such cases are problematic not only for all intentional views of pleasure but also for activity views such as Aristotle's, when these are taken to have as wide a scope as Feldman's, although they do not rule out accounts that appeal to activity or representation that we need not be aware of as such.) For all these reasons, the old-style 'Default Hedonism' Feldman misleadingly characterizes as 'sensory' and rejects on introspective grounds may be no worse off than the Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism for which he forsakes it.

On this same view of pleasure, as a single special propositional attitude, Feldman bases also his later constructions of 'hedonisms' that 'adjust' the value of 'episodes' of this attitudinal pleasure variously, as the case may be, according to their objects' Millian 'altitude', truth, worth, Moorean appropriateness for pleasure or pain, or Aristotelian merit. Versions adjusting pleasure's value to privileged upward-tending, more varied, more uniform, or better narratively-structured global patterns of pleasure in a life are also considered, and masterfully dismissed, as are also objections based on false pleasures, on the ground that the objectors these would satisfy mistake contemplating the lives in question from an observer's point of view for imagining them from the inside. Either the factors in question actually perturb the subjects, in which case hedonism will have already counted their hedonic effects, or else they do not, in which case also no further accommodation need be made. Similar considerations are used to turn the point of counterexamples similar to Nozick's 'experience machine'. Feldman is more sympathetic to the adjustment of the value of pleasure in terms of the worthiness of its objects, devaluing base and malicious ones, and this yields so-called Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism. However, he does not adopt it, suspecting that the objectors project their own tastes on the people in the examples. But when evaluating worlds (although not lives), Feldman sees a need to accommodate Ross's moral-desert-based intuitions, adopting Subject's Desert-Adjusted Intrinsic Attitudinal Hedonism, which adjusts the hedonic values of pains to count them as more or less bad, and of pleasures to count them as more or less good, according to their subjects' just deserts. Doing so involves taking intrinsic value, in the cases of lives and of worlds, to be different things (197-98). The disparity of this procedure with the metaphysics of value that often underlies hedonism, from the Cyrenaics to the classical utilitarians, on which the intrinsic value of all larger wholes reduces to that of momentary experience, could not be more evident. Neither could an ethical epistemology based in momentary apprehension of this value, as in Epicurus and Sidgwick, support the broader intuition-driven pure axiology, explicitly divorced from metaethics (14) and epistemology (206), that Feldman practices here.

This book begins admirably, clearly introducing, explaining, and illustrating its subject in a manner suited to a broad audience. Its middle chapters, however, move on too quickly to applications from the view of pleasure on which they are founded. (This is taken over from Feldman's papers, mostly collected in his Utilitarianism, Hedonism, and Desert, to which readers are sometimes referred for more argument and details.) This foundation seems shaky, as we have seen, even close to its home ground, and does not plausibly extend to all of pleasure, construed broadly as positive affect constitutively contributing to affective well-being. Moreover, if pleasure is in part or whole a psychobiological phenomenon, as it increasingly seems to be, its nature is not something to be stipulated in the interests of simplicity, elegance, versatility, and reconciliation in ethical theory. To get pleasure right, then, all these virtues and Feldman's ingenuity in analysis and responding to objections may not suffice. Whether and how pleasure, in part or whole, is one kind of affective process or a plurality, with more, less, or no generic unity, and whether it is felt or intentional always or only sometimes, will be for science to decide or at least to inform. Still this book remains valuable especially for its insightful discussion of many objections and alternatives to hedonism, from Plato to the present, and of Epicurus' attempts at its revision and Feldman's own--even as we must be wary of the dichotomous mold of sensations and propositional attitudes in which its contributions to moral psychology, value theory, and their histories are too often cast.