Plotinus and Epicurus: Matter, Perception, Pleasure

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Angela Longo and Daniela Patrizia Taormina (eds.), Plotinus and Epicurus: Matter, Perception, Pleasure, Cambridge University Press, 2016, 236pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107124219.

Reviewed by Francesco Verde, Sapienza University of Rome


This volume -- which includes revised versions of papers presented at three Italian symposia in 2012 and 2013 -- is a genuine novelty in the panorama of ancient philosophy studies. Indeed, the book investigates the relationship between two philosophers who (apparently) have nothing in common: Plotinus and Epicurus. The main subject is Plotinus, particularly his critical attitude toward Epicurus and atomism more generally. Given that a detailed volume dealing specifically with the doctrinal relationship between Plotinus and Epicurus was lacking, one can say that the chapters written by specialists in ancient philosophy and profitably collected by Angela Longo and Daniela Patrizia Taormina fill in a real 'black hole' in the historiography of ancient thought. In his Enneads Plotinus mentions the name of Epicurus once, in Treatise 33 (Enn. II 9, 15 8), which is devoted to the refutation of the (Christian) Gnostics (cf. too Porph. Plot. 16). Here Epicurus is paradoxically considered even better than the Gnostics who, with a doctrine whose roots are primarily Christological rather than stricto sensu philosophical (cf. the unsurpassed two volumes by Antonio Orbe, Cristología Gnóstica: Introducción a la soteriología de los siglos II y II, Biblioteca de Autores Cristianos, 1976), offend "the lord of providence" (pronoias kyrios) and providence itself (aute pronoia). As the editors show, Plotinus is notoriously reluctant to employ direct quotations (the single mention of Epicurus is the only citation of any post-Aristotelian philosopher by Plotinus), but a careful study of his work reveals that Epicureanism is undoubtedly one of his more important polemical targets. This volume thus helps to clarify the terms of this debate and, especially, to find and examine those many passages in which Plotinus deeply criticizes the materialistic philosophical positions of Epicurus, even if he does not quote him directly.

The book is divided into four parts: the first and shortest (Historical Overview) contains only a study that reconstructs, through the analysis of selected case studies, the destiny of Epicureanism in the Imperial Age. The second part (Common Anti-Epicurean Arguments in Plotinus) is dedicated to studying the largely 'silent/tacit' presence of Epicurus in the Enneads, while the third (Plotinus' Criticism of Epicurean Doctrines) investigates passages in which Plotinus criticizes several philosophical principles of Epicurus' thought, above all his materialism and the capacity of self-determination (the clinamen doctrine). Finally, the fourth part (Epicurean Elements in Plotinus: Some Instances) focuses on those texts in which Plotinus even seems to 'depend' on Epicurus from the point of view of the arguments raised by the philosopher in the elaboration of some undoubtedly significant doctrines.

In the short space of a review, it is not possible to take into full account the many ideas generated by reading this book; for this reason and since I believe that a review should be primarily informative, I outline the key aspects of all the book's chapters in order to give to the reader an overall picture.[1]

After a very interesting and useful introduction by the editors, which lays out not only the essential themes of the volume but also the detailed grounds underlying the research project that inspired its publication, Tiziano Dorandi ("The School and Texts of Epicurus in the Early Centuries of the Roman Empire") provides a useful overview of the school of Epicurus in the early centuries of the Roman Empire. Dorandi elects to dwell on certain key pieces of evidence: first, two inscriptions indicating the strong interest of Plotina, Trajan's widow, in the Epicurean school of Athens (which may be the same one founded by Epicurus, though that is impossible to prove at this time); second the personality of Diogenes Laertius (not an Epicurean philosopher but certainly an aware apologist of Epicureanism, as is evident from the transmission of some fundamental works of Epicurus in Book 10 of Diogenes' Lives of Eminent Philosophers); and finally the Oxyrhynchus Papyrus 5077, which is perhaps a kind of anthology of letters of Epicurus and/or the Epicureans showing the circulation of these texts as late as the first and second centuries AD.[2]  I add that, in the context of the Imperial Age, the testimonies of the Peripatetic Aristocles on Epicurus' notion of pleasure (Eus. PE XIV 21, 1-7 = F 8 M. L. Chiesara) are also interesting objects of investigation, as is Dionysius, the third-century Bishop of Alexandria and pupil of Origen, since his attack against Epicureanism concerns mainly the doctrine's physical and theological levels (cf. Eus. PE XIV 23, 1-27, 13 = frr. 1-7 R. S. Routh).[3]

The study by Longo ("The Mention of Epicurus in Plotinus' Tr. 33 (Enn. II 9) in the Context of the Polemics between Pagans and Christians in the Second-Third Century AD: Parallels between Celsus, Plotinus and Origen") examines the direct quotation of the name of Epicurus in Enn. II 9 in the wider context of the polemic against the Gnostics. Longo focuses on the fact that, in mentioning the philosopher's name, Plotinus connects the negation of providence to the pursuit of pleasure, a conceptual link absent from known Epicurean texts. Nevertheless, Longo finds interesting parallels to this connection in Celsus and Origen, meaning that the negation of providence leads to the absence of actual stimuli in the pursuit of moral virtue, and thus to the presence of obvious incentives to pleasure. As Longo remarks, this argument is typically an anti-Epicurean one, having been raised by both the Platonists (Plotinus) and the Christians (Origen).

Manuel Mazzetti ("Epicureans and Gnostics in Tr. 47 (Enn. III 2) 7.29-41") deals with Treatise 47, which is devoted to providence (pronoia); he notes that when Plotinus criticizes those who deny that providence extends to the earth, his prime targets are the Epicureans and the Gnostics rather than the Peripatetics.

The decisive character of Christian Gnostic thought within the broader context of the anti-Epicurean polemic is appropriately highlighted by Mauricio Pagotto Marsola ("'Heavy birds' in Tr. 5 (Enn. V 9) 1.8: References to Epicureanism and the Problem of Pleasure in Plotinus") in his examination of Treatise 5 on the intellect, the ideas, and being. Marsola focuses on the opening words of this text, in which Plotinus describes three different types of men, from the lowest grade (those who remain on the level of sense perception) to the highest one (the divine men who are able to rise to the intelligible realities). Plotinus states that the first group resemble birds that, although equipped with wings, cannot fly because they are too heavy. Marsola, on the basis of the Gnostic Tripartite Tractate and especially Irenaeus (adv. Haer. I 7, 5), argues that the three types of men in Plotinus may reflect the Gnostic distinction of material (or hylic), psychic and pneumatic men, as opposed to the usual exegesis that behind the Plotinian distinction lie Epicureans, Stoics/Aristotelians and Platonists.

Pierre-Marie Morel ("Plotinus, Epicurus and the Problem of Intellectual Evidence: Tr. 32 (Enn. V 5) 1", pp. 96-112) provides a keen study of the treatise on the relationship between the intelligibles and intellect.[4] Morel notes that in several passages of this text it is possible to find terms such as pistis, typos, eidolon, morphe and plege that can easily be attributed to the philosophy of Epicurus, although Morel, when examining the Plotinian denial of sense perception as the foundation of intellectual knowledge, does not rule out the possibility that Plotinus could be targeting both the Epicureans and the Peripatetics. One of Morel's most relevant points concerns a genuinely methodological issue: grasping what Plotinus was criticizing depends primarily on our understanding of the philosophical school being attacked. This applies equally to Epicurean philosophy, if it is regarded not as mere sensualism but as rational empiricism.

The study by Taormina ("'What is Known through Sense Perception is an Image'. Plotinus' Tr. 32 (Enn. V 5) 1.12-19: An Anti-Epicurean Argument?") closes the second part of the book, dealing with the same Treatise (V 5) examined by Morel. Taormina demonstrates a very valuable knowledge of Epicurean sources (including the Herculaneum Papyri and Epicureans like Demetrius of Laconia and Diogenes of Oinoanda), thanks to which she can conclude that the passage in I 12-19, which is also examined from the philological point of view, is directed against Epicurus. In this text, Plotinus denies that sense perception can grasp the object itself, since it can only grasp an image (eidolon) of the thing; however, I would not rule out also a reference to the meaning of eidolon in Pl. Soph. 240a 7-8; cf. too Theaet. 191d 3-9, and Resp. IX 586c 3-5). Moreover, it is worth observing that in V 5 (32) I 17 Plotinus uses the term antilepsis, which can also be attributed to the Epicurean technical vocabulary, at least on the basis of Plutarch (adv. Col. 1109D = 250 Hermann Usener) and Diogenes of Oinoanda (fr. 5 II 7-8 M. F. Smith).

Marco Ninci ("Corporeal Matter, Indefiniteness and Multiplicity: Plotinus' Critique of Epicurean Atomism in Tr. 12 (Enn. II 4) 7.20-8") provides a very stimulating systematic study of Treatise 12 on matter.  Thanks to a close comparison with Epicurus' Letter to Herodotus and using some decisive passages of Aristotle's Physics, Ninci explains the differences between Plotinus' and Epicurus' conceptions of matter. According to Plotinus, if matter consists of atoms, it is simply not matter, because it is not able to justify the fundamental characteristics of corporeal bodies: continuity and fluidity. Despite this criticism, Ninci rightly emphasises the active character of Epicurus' atoms against the absolute passivity of Plotinus' matter. For exactly this reason, one could add, against the demiurge of the Timaeus, that the Epicureans argue that "although Plato was right to acknowledge that the world had an origin, even if he was not right to introduce a divine craftsman of it, instead of employing nature as its craftsman, he was wrong to say that it is imperishable" (Diog. Oen. NF 155 = YF 200; transl. J. Hammerstaedt-M. F. Smith. See too Cic. ND I 53).

Erik Eliasson's chapter ("Plotinus' Reception of Epicurean Atomism in On Fate, Tr. 3 (Enn. III 1) 1-3") examines the anti-determinist arguments raised by Plotinus and dwells on the fact that Plotinus in all likelihood criticizes Epicurus because atoms can justify neither the order of the cosmos nor the activity of the soul.

Andrei Cornea's "Athroa epibolē: On an Epicurean Formula in Plotinus' Work" opens the fourth and final part of the book; it focuses on the expression athroa epibole -- which Cornea translates as "concentrated approach" (p. 180) -- at the beginning of Epicurus' Letter to Herodotus (35). Cornea notes that the same expression is found in Plotinus (Tr. 28, 30 and 45) and reaches the conclusion that the Platonic philosopher could have taken this formula directly from Epicurus or from some Epicurean manual. I wish to point out that the attribution to the Epicurean Polystratus of PHerc. 346 (in which the formula athroa epibole appears: cf. col. IV 25-26 Capasso) is far from obvious, as we read in the article (p. 180), especially after the reservations of Robert Philippson and Mario Capasso, the most recent editor of that papyrus (cf. G. Del Mastro, Titoli e annotazioni bibliologiche nei papiri greci di Ercolano, Centro Internazionale per lo Studio dei Papiri Ercolanesi 'Marcello Gigante', 2014, p. 131), regarding the attribution to Polystratus proposed by Achille Vogliano.

The volume closes with a stimulating chapter by Alessandro Linguiti ("Plotinus and Epicurus on Pleasure and Happiness"), which studies the deep differences between Plotinus' conception of happiness (strictly linked to the activity of the "undescended soul") and Epicurus' hedonism. Beyond these differences, however, Linguiti detects a significant similarity: both Plotinus and Epicurus, likely depending on the rich Academic-Peripatetic debates on pleasure and its limits, share the idea that happiness does not increase with time. Both philosophers join the Stoics in believing that happiness, when it exists, is completely perfect in the present (cf. Enn. I 5 (36)).

The volume is accompanied by a rich general "Bibliography" divided into two sections: primary texts and secondary literature. It also has a useful "Index locorum" (pp. 215-223), an "Index of Modern Authors" (pp. 224-226) and a precious "Index of Main Concepts" (pp. 227-236). The book reflects quality from the editorial point of view, with only a few misprints (e.g. p. 87 l. 21 «ἀπλανὴς» not «ἀπλαγὴς»; p. 140 l. 2: «Aristotle» not «Artistotle»; p. 180 l. 31: «ἀθρό|αι» not «ἀθρόαι»; p. 213 l. 28 «Timasagora» not «Timasacora»).

Finally, the scholarly community owes a debt of gratitude to both the editors and the contributors for the publication of this volume, which has to be regarded as a pioneering book that provides an essential foundation on which to build further research into Plotinus' polemical attitude while elucidating a crucial and largely neglected aspect of the Epicurean Wirkungsgeschichte.

[1] I intend to return more in detail on this volume in a critical note which will be published in the 2017 issue of the international journal Antiquorum Philosophia.

[2] This document was published in 2011 by Dirk Obbink and Stefan Schorn in the series The Oxyrhynchus Papyri, Vol. LXXVI, pp. 37-50. This edition has been the subject of a painstaking study by Anna Angeli, "Lettere di Epicuro dall'Egitto (POxy LXXVI 5077)", Studi di Egittologia e Papirologia 10/2013, pp. 9-31, whose conclusions Dorandi closely follows.

[3] Cf. K. J. Fleischer, Dionysios von Alexandria, De natura (περὶ φύσεως): Übersetzung, Kommentar und Würdigung: Mit einer Einleitung zur Geschichte des Epikureismus in Alexandria, Brepols, 2016.

[4] I note that the term used by Plotinus to indicate that connection is significantly syzeugnymi -- V 5 (32) 1, 23-24 -- which is a verb that plays a decisive role in the Gnostic context: as a matter of fact, the syzygies ["yoked together"] mean the divine couples of Eons, which, according to the Gnostic 'galaxy', constitute the Pleroma: cf. e.g. 'Hipp.' Ref. VI 12, 2 on Simon the Magician's doctrine.