Plotinus' Legacy: The Transformation of Platonism from the Renaissance to the Modern Era

Placeholder book cover

Stephen Gersh (ed.), Plotinus' Legacy: The Transformation of Platonism from the Renaissance to the Modern Era, Cambridge University Press, 2019, 298pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108415286.

Reviewed by Lloyd P. Gerson, University of Toronto


Plotinus (204/5-270 C.E.) has an unusually complex profile, especially in the modern history of philosophy. He explicitly claimed to be nothing more than an exegete of Plato, and in the eyes of Proclus (412-485 C.E.), he was indeed the great exegete of the Platonic revelation. An additional point is worth emphasizing, one to which I shall return. Plotinus thought that Plato had largely expressed the truth, although on occasion he spoke "enigmatically." This is worth remembering because even if one accepts Plotinus' claim to be nothing more than an exegete of Plato, one has to keep in mind that exegesis is held by him to be in the service of truth, not in the service of a publication. Hence, contemporary exegetes of Plotinus may legitimately wonder if Plotinus' efforts to get at the sense behind Plato's words actually undercuts or even obliterates his bona fides as a guide to Plato. There are two overwhelmingly influential facts about the modern historiography of philosophy that further cloud this picture.

First, in the Renaissance and in the centuries following, efforts to recover or appropriate Plato led some to conclude that Plotinus was something other than a faithful and acute -- though admittedly fallible -- exegete of Plato. In fact, so it was argued, Plotinus introduced considerable novelty into his exegesis, particularly in his systematization of the artful disarray of the dialogues. He was actually more accurately labeled a "Neo-Platonist," where the prefix "Neo" was definitely a pejorative and indicated mostly alien accretions to the Platonic body. Labeled thus, Plotinus went on to experience significant guilt by association -- association with those later philosophers and self-declared followers of Plato who quite openly and enthusiastically took a syncretic approach, incorporating, broadly speaking, a multitude of Mediterranean religious beliefs and practices into their philosophical work. What prompted the syncretism? That obvious question brings us to the second fact.

Plotinus certainly knew of early Christian doctrines apart from the actual religious practices of what was during his life a relatively minor sect. But he didn't pay much attention to them, with the exception of one treatise, Against the Gnostics, which implicitly includes as opponents some thinkers who were too early to be declared Christian heretics. Matters changed dramatically with Plotinus' successor, Porphyry (234-c.305 C.E.). Christianity had risen in prominence sufficiently to be the target of systematic Imperial persecution. Porphyry wrote a treatise, Against the Christians, which reflected the threat to Hellenic culture presented by Christianity, and especially to Hellenic philosophy which by the end of the 3rd century was essentially identical with Platonism. Porphyry did not live to see the Emperor Constantine pronounce the Edict of Milan in 313, which lifted the repressive laws of his predecessor Diocletian, nor did he witness Constantine's own conversion to Christianity. By the end of the first quarter of the 4th century C.E., any even moderately perceptive pagan thinker could read the writing on the wall. From that time forward, Platonists were busy trying to make Platonism into a plausible and attractive competitor to Christianity. By the time of the closing of Plato's Academy in Athens in 529 CE -- just to take a convenient date -- there were few openly pagan Platonists around. But there were ever after numerous Christian thinkers who put the exegesis of Plato to the service of Christian doctrine. By the time that Plotinus' own writings could be brought out from the shadow of Proclus and, more importantly, the Christian so-called Pseudo-Dionysius, this being done through Marsilio Ficino's (1433-1499) monumental translation of the Enneads in the 1480s and Latin edition in 1492, Plotinus' qualifications as an exegete of Plato were ignored and his works were mined for his (Neo-) Platonic contribution to Christian theology or Christian humanism. This complicated picture could be elaborated upon, especially including Hegel's important views regarding the contribution of Plotinus to a post-Christian philosophical system. But perhaps enough has already been said to alert the reader to what might seem an obvious point: serious hermeneutical questions need to be asked when reading what later philosophers and historians of philosophy have to say about Plotinus.

The present volume, edited by the distinguished historian of Platonism, Stephen Gersh, presents a group of essays that recount the reception of Plotinus in the Renaissance and after, including, somewhat sketchily, the 20th century.

For those who are not especially familiar with Plotinus' Enneads, it might be useful to read Kevin Corrigan's "Plotinus and Modern Scholarship: From Ficino to the Twenty-First Century" first. There, Corrigan describes the strange occlusion of Plotinus' writings in late antiquity right up to the Renaissance, including the paraphrase of parts of the Enneads, transmitted perhaps in Syriac and then into Arabic and then Latin under the title The Theology of Aristotle, a misattribution not exactly conducive to historical clarity. The edition, Latin translation, and commentary by Ficino was indeed a watershed that for a variety of reasons dominated the way Plotinus was understood well into the 19th century.

Gersh's "Marsilio Ficino as Commentator on Plotinus: Some Case Studies" is illuminating and foundational in the sense that it reveals the challenges that most subsequent philosophers were to face in efforts to Christianize Plotinus. These challenges include: how to make the absolutely simple impersonal first principle of all in Plotinus cohere with the God of scripture, especially when conceptualized as a trinity; how to reconcile salvation by philosophy with salvation by grace; and how to reconcile the Platonic ideal of separation from the body with the Christian doctrine of the ideal as culminating in resurrection. In the face of these and other difficulties, Renaissance humanists inevitably resorted to metaphor, obfuscation, and simply ignoring of inconvenient texts and doctrines. It should be added, though, that up until early in the 16th century, any Christian trying to understand Plotinus or, for that matter, Plato or Proclus, could still legitimately operate under the assumption that the student of Proclus, Pseudo-Dionysius, was in fact the Christian disciple of Paul and so the purveyor of a thoroughly Christianized Platonic metaphysics or, as some might have argued, a Platonized Christian metaphysics. Under this assumption, any deviations from what was at least consistent with Christian theology could be viewed as a defect perpetrated by a wayward pagan.

Brian Copenhaver's nice essay on the preternaturally learned Pico della Mirandola (1463-1494) explains one of the coping strategies of the times, namely, the harmonization not only of the philosophies of Plato and Aristotle -- a view that was well established in late antiquity -- but also of these with Avicenna, Averroes, and the Jewish Kabbalah. In della Mirandola's fascinating 900 Conclusions, where 15 of the first 400 are conclusiones secundum Plotinum, there are some striking and authentic insights into the teachings of Plotinus, though Pico's reluctance to have his insights published during his lifetime suggests that he saw the difficulty of reconciling these with orthodoxy.

Even though the falsehood behind the claim that Dionysius was the disciple of Paul began to be questioned in the middle of the 15th century and then publicly refuted by Erasmus at the beginning of the 16th century, humanists across Europe continued to use him as leverage for the inclusion of Platonic texts into curricula. In "Jacques Lefèvre d'Étaples and Charles de Bovelles on Platonism, Theurgy, and Intellectual Difficulty," Richard J. Oosterhoff explains that in France, Lefèvre (c.1455-1536) and de Bovelles (1479-c.1567) were instrumental in bringing the Latin Plotinus to the arts faculty at Paris thereby threatening the hegemony of Aristotle. In reply to the objection that Plotinus and other pagan philosophers were sources of heresy, Lefèvre took the predictable tack of claiming that Plotinus' metaphysics was a Dionysian knock-off, indeed a kind of deformation of holy scripture. Not much can be said for their insistence that the One of Plotinus was indeed another name for the God of scripture besides the existence of precedents. Among the so-called Middle Platonists we find the conflation of the demiurge of Timaeus with the Idea of the Good or the One. Whether or not this might make sense in some half-baked stew of ideas, it does not stand up to any serious study of the relevant texts. Still, just as Plotinus himself could admire the uprightness of a Stoic like Epictetus, 16th century French humanists could admire the philosophical piety of Plotinus.

In "Symphorien Champier on Medicine, Theology, and Politics," Guido Giglioni presents the curious Platonic medico-theology of Symphorien Champier (1471? -1538), showing us how far humanists could diverge from serious study of Plotinus. Along with the predictable conflation of the three Plotinian hypostases One-Intellect-Soul with the persons of the Trinity, Champier imagined that a philosophy of medicine, drawn in part from Galen, was continuous with a Christianized Platonic theology. Apart from the hoary micro-macrocosmic trope, and the analogies of physical and psychical health in Plato's Gorgias and Republic and elsewhere, it takes some imaginative footwork to make all this Plotinian except in the most attenuated manner. It is noteworthy that Champier appeals to Numenius for support in conflating the demiurge with the One, thereby revealing at least a tincture of scholarly respectability. After all, Porphyry tells us that Plotinus was accused of actually plagiarizing from Numenius. As Giglioni concludes, Champier's Plotinus is really just a potted version of Ficino's fantasy.

When we come to the so-called Cambridge Platonists Henry More (1614-1687), Ralph Cudworth (1617-1688), and John Smith (1618-1652), we find the encounters with Plotinus both somewhat more accurate as exegesis and more philosophically acute. In part, this was no doubt owing to the flourishing of philosophy generally in Europe in the 17th century and the new physics. It was also the case that philosophical inquiry was to attain a measure of independence by its separation from non-philosophical scripturally-focused forms of Protestantism.

David Leech's illuminating piece on Henry More and Descartes shows how the latter became for the former the sort of foil that Stoics and Epicureans were for Plotinus. What More grasped about Plotinus was that he maintained a top-down metaphysics as opposed to any form of materialism that must hold that whatever may appear to be immaterial must in fact be supervenient upon or epiphenomenal to the material. Grasping that, he was led to look seriously at Plotinus' attempt to explain how immaterial being (and the eternity of the immaterial) could actually be always present to the sensible universe. With this More thought he could combat Cartesian dualism. Perhaps so. Ironically, More may have had a good case for holding that souls (as opposed to intellects) are essentially embodied, but not so good a case in holding that Plotinus denied this. More inevitably ran into difficulties regarding the presence of souls in bodies and, more critically, the presence of Christian divinity in the sensible world generally. Leech makes clear that More is torn by his efforts to meet Cartesian arguments, accommodate mechanistic physics, and maintain a measure of orthodoxy in a version of Protestantism that was still sufficiently doctrinal for the notion of orthodoxy to make any sense.

I found Douglas Hedley's "Ralph Cudworth as Interpreter of Plotinus" among the most philosophically interesting in the book. It was Cudworth who studied Hobbes and Spinoza and turned explicitly to Plotinus to meet their materialistic challenges. Cudworth, like More, recognized that Platonism was wedded to a top-down metaphysics and that materialistic philosophies were adamantly opposed to this. Perhaps Cudworth was the first in the modern era to recognize in Plotinus (but also especially in Proclus) the anti-materialistic implications of the phenomenon of consciousness. Specifically, the self-reflexivity of consciousness in thinking could not be supervenient on a materialistic foundation. Another feature of Cudworth's Plotinian philosophy is his explicit recognition of the inseparability of ethics from metaphysics. Here, too, the self-reflexivity of thinking is essential for the possibility of human responsibility. The title of Cudworth's main work, The True Intellectual System of the Universe (1678), could have been a title of a work by Plotinus, especially the inclusion of "Intellect" in the metaphysical system.

John Smith who, owing to his brief life, did not have the impact of More and Cudworth, nevertheless shows an authentically philosophical approach to Plotinus. He aimed to defend rational theology against materialists of all sorts, focusing on the centrality of the immortality of the soul. Derek A. Michaud ("John Smith on the Immortality of the Soul") gives us a clear presentation of how Smith uses Plotinus' own treatises on the soul in the construction of his defense of the soul's immortality. Following Plotinus, Smith recognizes that the proof of the immateriality of the soul must precede any proof of its immortality. To sum up Michaud's exposition of Smith's arguments, the unity of consciousness in sense-perception but also in propositional assertions could not be adequately explained if the soul were a body or a property of a body. To this he adds Cudworth's insights regarding self-reflexivity and one of the more striking philosophical insights of all the early modern followers of Plotinus, namely, that cognition was essentially a unificatory process, seeing a manifold as one ultimately and logically culminating in an absolutely simple first principle of all, the source both of being and of cognition. Michaud only briefly touches on the connection between Cudworth's daughter and John Locke who through her came to know Smith's work. One would very much like to see more work on Locke on personal identity in the light of his predecessors at Cambridge.

The serious academic study of the history of ancient philosophy is essentially a product of the German university system. Its post-Christian cast is a function of the aftermath of the Thirty Years War and the increasing desire to work on neutral ground, so to speak. The eighteenth-century German histories of philosophy also gave us a benighted notion of a purified Hellenism that saw in Plotinus an alien presence. With Schelling and Hegel, in particular, philosophy and academic history of philosophy encounter Plotinus in a new and provocative manner. Schelling was especially keen to study Plotinus, seeing in him an idealist avant la lettre. In "Schelling and Plotinus," Thomas Leinkauf's difficult but valuable sketch of Schelling's appropriation of Plotinus gives us Schelling's clear sense of the uniquely hierarchical top-down metaphysics of Platonists generally. And yet Schelling could not reconcile the Plotinian first principle of all with the Absolute understood in a Christian context. I take it that what Leinkauf calls Schelling's "identity philosophy" seeks to carry through the Plotinian insight that the first principle of all -- if indeed it is a first principle of all -- must manifest its absolute identity always and everywhere but in an increasingly diminished way. I am not sure I understand Schelling's claim, as explained by Leinkauf, that the One must be seen as having the trinitarian manifold in itself. Schelling was right to emphasize the Plotinian idea that the One is uniquely self-caused, which is just another way of saying that it is uniquely uncaused. But Schelling, like Hegel, who sought to make history an essentially part of his philosophy, set himself apart from Plotinus's ahistorical metaphysics. It is not the case that Christian conceptions of God could not reject absolute simplicity for the first principle, but that for Plotinus the only acceptable argument for the first principle of all was that it was uniquely absolutely simple. There is no space to discuss here Leinkauf's account of Schelling's philosophy of nature and its provocative uses of Plotinus except to mention the profoundly different conception of matter that Schelling is led to propose.

Hegel believed that Proclus was a more reliable exegete of Plato than was Plotinus, largely because the latter was too influenced by Aristotle. Believing myself that Aristotle was a Platonist, I do not find this an impediment to Plotinus' credentials as an interpreter of Plato. Jens Halfwassen, in a typically clear and insightful examination of Hegel's use of Plotinus, focuses on the main difficulty. Hegel identifies the Absolute with Intellect, certainly characterized along Plotinian lines. But as Plotinus insisted, Aristotle was wrong to identify the first principle of all with Intellect, since Intellect is not absolutely simple. Perhaps Plotinus would have said to Hegel that he was the one too influenced by Aristotle. At any rate, I found Halfwassen's "Hegel's Programmatic Recourse to the Ancient Philosophy of Intellect" to be an excellent account of the concrete universal as the content of Intellect which is, eternally, cognitively identical with all intelligible being. The self-thinking of Intellect is authentically Plotinian; it is anti-Plotinian in the identification of it with the Absolute, as Halfwassen somewhat ruefully acknowledges.

The last paper in the volume prior to Corrigan's survey of scholarship is in fact the only one discussing Plotinianism in the twentieth century. It is a paper on Henri Bergson (1859-1941), focusing on his devotion to Plotinus, tellingly without a religious modesty covering. Bergson's extraordinary fame in his day and his explicit enthusiasm for Plotinus still accounts for the tradition of Neoplatonic scholarship in France at present. Wayne J. Hankey ("Henri-Louis Bergson and Plotinus") takes as central to Bergson's thought the idea of intellectual intuition which, as I construe it, is unificatory cognition as mentioned above. Bergson clearly saw this as a response to Kant and part of a defense of the possibility of metaphysics. If we can appeal to Aristotle for assistance here, we can rely on his distinction between things or events or processes that are many in logos, but one in being, like teaching and learning. Our intuition -- it is real, even paradigmatic cognition, as Plotinus emphasizes again and again -- that the many are in reality one is an affront to the sort of empiricism that Bergson rejected but it is essential to human cognition. To be united with the One, which Plotinus himself identified with erōs, is for Bergson the culmination of a path of unification. Hankey only has space to mention briefly two French Neoplatonists, Jean Trouillard and Henri Duméry, whose profound work carried this insight further.

This modestly-intentioned collection of able essays, broadly characterizable as Geistesgeschichte, will be useful for those interested in Renaissance philosophy, in British philosophy in the 17th century, and in German idealism. For Plotinus in the 20th century, other writings by Hankey would be more helpful, especially his One Hundred Years of Neoplatonism in France: A Brief Philosophical History (2006).