Plotinus: Myth, Metaphor, and Philosophical Practice

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Stephen R.L. Clark, Plotinus: Myth, Metaphor, and Philosophical Practice, University of Chicago Press, 2016, 344pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226339672.

Reviewed by Michael Chase, CNRS Centre Jean Pépin


This is a bold work that applies a new approach to the interpretation of the thought of the founder of Neoplatonism. It is not a systematic historical study of Plotinus, nor an analysis of his arguments, but an attempt, as the author writes,

to show how Plotinus would have us live here-now, and what the world of our experience might seem if we reformed our wills and imagination, whether or not the universe is as he argued that it was. Even his most metaphysical utterances can be given a therapeutic and this-worldly meaning. (p. 297)

Stephen R.L. Clark intends, moreover, to try "to develop and check [Plotinus'] texts against our own experience of the world and the evidence of other -- seemingly similar -- traditions". (p. xv.) This means he will compare elements of Plotinus' philosophy to aspects of Christian, Jewish, and Indian thought. Finally, Clark brings to bear his own broad range of interests, he lists "the biological underpinnings of our ethical and religious attitudes, the moral status of [nonhuman] animals, the nature of mental disorders, and the philosophy of religion" (p. xvi), to the study of Plotinus. This explains the impressive breadth and variety of the literature he quotes, including authors one would not expect to find quoted in a scholarly monograph (e.g. Eckart Tolle, Alan Watts). Clark has read a great many very interesting books, and bringing them to the reader's attention is not the least service rendered by this intriguing and challenging work.

The approach used, then, is neither Continental nor Analytic, but can be located more in the tradition of the late French thinker Pierre Hadot, who sought, among other things, to discover what impact the study of ancient philosophy might be able to have on the way we live our lives today. The approach has its potential benefits and its perils. When practiced carefully, it can remove the study of ancient philosophy from the exclusive domain of dusty antiquarianism, showing how it can still remain relevant to the interests of readers today. The risk, however, is that of anachronism: bending the thought of an ancient author until it coincides with contemporary concerns may give it a quite different form from the one that author originally intended. By and large, Clark manages to avoid the dangers of anachronism and present the thought of Plotinus as eminently relevant to life in the 21st century.

The book is divided into five parts, each consisting of an irregular number of chapters. Part One discusses how and why to read Plotinus, theories of metaphor, and dialectic. Part Two surveys Plotinus' use of metaphors such as drunkenness, nakedness, and dancing. Part Three studies his use of myths, images such as spheres and circles, charms and countercharms, demons, fixed stars and planets. Such images and metaphors are no mere literary or rhetorical flourishes, but "spiritual or imaginative exercises, which could be expected to have a transformative effect on those willing to follow them through" (p. ix). Part Four studies the traditional Plotinian hypostases, in inverse order: Matter, Nature, Soul, Nous, and the One. Finally, a brief Part Five, "The Plotinian Way", serves as a conclusion.

No doubt the most refreshing aspect of this work is the focus on what it might mean for us to live according to Plotinus' philosophy, which Clark is not afraid to claim "might be 'literally' and 'factually' right" (p. 14) and "is at least consistent with everything we now think we know about reality" (p. 231). Whether or not he was right on metaphysical or ontological issues, however, Plotinus correctly saw that the world of our everyday existence is structured by our fears and fantasies. Plotinus' famous doctrine of the fall of the soul (e.g. IV.8 [6].4.11-12) is interpreted as referring to our abandoning the present in favor of regrets about the past and anticipations of the future (p. 180). We can begin to emerge from our limited, parochial view of reality by imagining being someone else, or seeing things from another angle (p. 196); thus, to find a new way of seeing is to find a new way of being (p. 205). We can be helped in this direction by contemplating the fixed stars and their eternal recurrences (p. 214), but the most sure-fire means of awakening from the illusory prison of our worries and regrets is to realize that the other beings around us are separate existents, each of which has its own perspective on reality (p. 71). This may be the book's most profound insight: that by glimpsing how things seem to another soul, we "are reminded both that we are souls ourselves and that there is a world vaster and more beautiful than any we see when confined to our own fantasy (p. 261)".

Clark's work is filled with interesting, and sometime provocative, suggestions for understanding Plotinus' work. For instance, he tells us that Plotinus may have practiced an ars memoriae, perhaps using signs of the zodiac and constellations as mnemonic loci (ch. 10), and his auditors may have attempted to "imagine themselves into" the narrative of myths and Platonic dialogues, thus internalizing their characters and discovering the Thrasymachus or Odysseus within themselves (ch. 12). Clark's comparison of some aspects of Plotinian thought to the Dreamtime of the Australian Aborigines (p. 270) is especially thought-provoking.

Sometimes, however, Clark's suggestions seem overly speculative. While it is true, as he argues eloquently in his Preface (p. xii-xiii), that no author ever writes down everything he knows, this does not provide us with a license to foist upon him whatever beliefs we choose. Pace Clark, there is no reason to believe that Plotinus practiced dancing ( especially not on the rather flimsy grounds that Socrates did, at least according to Xenophon (p. 114)), breathing exercises, the repetition of sacred syllables (p. 165 n. 10), or the burning of incense to the star divinities (p. 285-86), or that he believed in "complex hierarchies of angels, powers, and principalities to guard . . . spiritual ascent" (p. 184). There is also no reason to call into question (p. 292) Porphyry's testimony that Plotinus was uninterested in the public aspect of religious cults: one cannot imagine why Porphyry, who does seem to have been a religious man, should have falsely imputed to his revered master an attitude which Porphyry himself probably found regrettable.

Clark sometimes seems to exaggerate the proximity between paganism and Christianity. Aristotle's ton theon theorein kai therapeuein (Eudemian Ethics 8, 1249b20) does not mean "to love and serve the Lord" (p. 268), but "to contemplate and serve the god". It seems unlikely that Plotinus was influenced by Philo in his image of people stripping naked before entering a shrine (p. 53; p. 60 n. 72), since Philo seems to have left virtually no trace on pagan literature elsewhere. Even less likely is the suggestion Plotinus may have been influenced by the Old Testament (p. 181 n. 4). I doubt that "there was a strand of pagan thought considerably more ascetic than even Christian monasticism" (p. 243). It was Christians, not pagans, who spent decades living on top of pillars or in boxes where they could not stand up straight, and who boasted, like Sarapion, "I am more of a corpse than you are" (see Dodds, Pagans and Christians in an Age of Anxiety, Cambridge 1965, pp. 33-34). The counter-example Clark cites is Marcus Aurelius 6.13, but this is merely an exercise destined to make the loss of luxury items easier to bear. Pace Liebeschutz, there really is not all that much resemblance between the stories of Christ and of Heracles -- certainly not enough to suggest (p. 140 n. 8) that the pagans may have modeled their beliefs on Christian theology. To be sure, Heracles was the son of (a) god, but so were most Greek heroes. Both Christ and Heracles, Clark claims, were required to "labor" in the service of humanity, but it seems a stretch to speak of Christ's deeds as "labors". Heracles, the womanizing, rambunctious brawler who killed a cupbearer for splashing him with water, and once slept with fifty women in a night, seems about as distant from Christ as one can get. Christ is said to have died -- voluntarily -- to save man from the condemnation he deserved for his sins; Heracles dies -- accidentally -- as a result of his wife's ill-conceived plot to make him cease his adulteries. The differences between the two are rather more striking than the similarities.

One sometimes gets the sense that Plotinus is being enlisted in a battle that is not his own. Clark makes it clear that he has a bone to pick with unnamed individuals he sometimes refers to as "atheistic naturalists" or even "atheistical idealists". The elephant in the room is, one presumes, Richard Dawkins. It is possible to share Clark's aversion to the excesses of a certain materialist, reductionist tendency among some contemporary scientists and philosophers of science. But there is an equal danger in Christianizing Plotinus, as when Plotinus is said to speak of us "being taken up into the godhead" (p. 267). Plotinus sometimes seems to brought in as a weapon with which to bludgeon the unbelievers: it may well be, for instance, that matter cannot give rise to consciousness, but this is not what Plotinus means (p. 259) when he says that Soul made all things.

Unfortunately, Clark's own religious parti pris occasionally make him lapse into a kind of grumpy sectarianism, as when (p. 142) he fustigates those who dare to doubt the tales of Christian saints and martyrs, declares (p. 292) that organized cult is necessary for faith, or derides those who, entering upon a spiritual path, "sometimes seem to be aiming mainly . . . to be reconciled to their own past misdeeds and follies -- but not to pay for them" (p. 283, with a reference in the note to Matthew 18:8 and its threat of being thrown into an eternal flame). Those of us who are not Christians -- and not all of us are therefore "atheists" -- may feel uncomfortable at such exclusionary statements, which seem to fall short of the grandiose vision of the value of a plurality of perspectives which Clark so brilliantly discovers in Plotinus.

Indeed, Clark's most important theme, which runs through his book, is that Plotinus can teach us how, by freeing ourselves from the tyranny of our own narrow, parochial interests, we can come to see reality as it really is. In turn, he suggests, this veridical vision is of a world in which the difference between subject and object is abolished, and all times and places are seen to be equally real (pp. 269-270). Thus, the return to our intelligible homeland which Plotinus preaches is seen to amount to a change in our way of looking at things. One main way to achieve such a change is to use our faculty of empathy (although Clark does not use this term): because we can imagine "being someone else", or seeing from another angle, we can begin to form an image of the real things of which our senses give us only partial views. (p. 196). This insight into the value of a variety of perspectives, which Clark derives from Plotinus, can, in my view, be viewed as a manifesto for interdisciplinarity in academic studies, tolerance in religion, and multiculturalism in the social sphere.

Yet this is only one insight among many that Clark has provided in his highly intelligent, learned, and beautifully written work, which constitutes an important contribution to Plotinian scholarship and to philosophy in general.