Plotinus on Consciousness

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D. M. Hutchinson, Plotinus on Consciousness, Cambridge University Press, 2018, 209pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781108424769.

Reviewed by Damian Caluori, Trinity University


The view that ancient philosophers made no use of the notion of consciousness, and perhaps even the view that consciousness does not enter philosophical discourse before Descartes, may still have its adherents. However, anyone who reads the Enneads can hardly overlook the fact that consciousness plays an important role in Plotinus. D. M. Hutchinson's study is thus most welcome as it is hoped that its discussion will motivate scholars of ancient philosophy and beyond to study Plotinus' contribution to the history of the philosophy of this remarkable phenomenon, consciousness.

It is a well-known fact that the term "consciousness" is used to refer to a number of distinct, though related, phenomena. According to David Armstrong (1980) 55-67, for example, it may refer to sub-perceptual mental states such as those of dreaming, to perceptual states of awareness, to second-order awareness that usually accompanies first-order awareness (e.g. while hearing, I am aware that I am hearing) as well as to self-consciousness where the subject, the self, is aware of itself as a unified thing. While Plotinus does not use any single term (such as "consciousness") to refer to all conscious phenomena, he instead, as Hutchinson points out, uses a number of terms for what we would call phenomena of consciousness. Following the classic study by Hans-Rudolf Schwyzer (1960), Hutchinson distinguishes "consciousness" or "self-consciousness" (parakolouthēsis), and two terms that he both translates as "awareness" (sunaisthēsis and sunesis). He adds "apprehension" (antilēpsis) to Schwyzer's list. Since sunesis is of less significance in Hutchinson's study, I will focus on the other three.

After a chapter on the self, Hutchinson structures his study by the kind of entity that is in states referred to by these terms. He makes use of the psychological framework provided by Damian Caluori (2015) in distinguishing three layers in Plotinus' psychology where psychic activity occurs: the soul-trace, the lower soul, and the higher soul, devoting a chapter to each layer. A final chapter on self-determination and an appendix discussing the history of the four consciousness-terms completes his study.

According to the three psychic levels, Hutchinson distinguishes three "levels of selfhood" and explains: "By 'level' I mean a discrete stage in the actualization of the true self" (7) whereby he, to my mind rightly, identifies the true self as the higher soul. He claims that "the self is a seat of awareness that fluctuates along these levels, belonging to the level of reality on which it focuses its attention" (7). He elaborates further: "We determine what the self is by the beliefs we commit ourselves to, the value judgements we make, and the actions we perform" (10). Now to which layer does the term "we" in this last sentence refer? In the light of the previous sentence, it would seem to fluctuate as well. But this cannot be correct. For there are no beliefs and value-judgements on the level of the soul-trace. The soul-trace rather only deals with a body's vegetative functions and with non-conceptualized feelings, sensations, and desires. As Hutchinson himself explains: "'We' are discursive reasoning; the qualified [=living] body [where the soul-trace operates] is not who 'we' really are . . . Nevertheless, 'we' can sink to this level of selfhood by adopting a way of life that indulges in bodily affections" (46). Thus, since discursive reasoning belongs to the lower soul, we are the lower soul even when we "indulge in bodily affections." If so, the self does not fluctuate; the awareness of our bodily pleasures occurs in the lower soul when it "sinks" to the level of the trace. It just makes the mistake of believing that what it is is the soul-trace or the qualified body.

Similarly, with regard to its upper neighbor: Hutchinson agrees with the standard view that the higher soul "remains in the intelligible world" (4) and does not descend into the sensible world. He (more controversially) identifies the higher soul as an intellect: "The pure intellect is the noetic self, which is experienced when we self-identify with our intellect" (119). What does "we" in this sentence refer to? It seems to me that, again, it is the lower soul when it no longer cares for a body but has ascended to the intelligible world (e.g. Enn. IV.4.1; IV.8.1). Plotinus nowhere speaks of a fluctuating self and all the passages where he uses the terms "we" or "I" can be explained without hypostasizing the self and without seeing it as an entity in addition to the items in Plotinus' ontology that are already familiar from the tradition, notably intellects, souls, and living bodies. The only problem, in my view, for an account that does not hypostasize the self is the relation of the true self (the higher soul) to the self of our daily life (the lower soul), a problem that is perhaps not insoluble (Caluori (2015) 162-79). Such an alternative account does not imply, of course, that there is no conscious activity occurring on the level of the soul-trace; it only implies that we are not the primary subject of such experiences; the primary subject rather is the biological organism (the living or qualified body) to which we are attached and for which we care while being embodied.

The soul-trace animates the qualified body, and, in virtue of it, "embodied human beings have the capacities associated with plant life (nourishment, reproduction, and the passive power of sense perception)" (11). Now one way in which consciousness may come into play on this level would seem to be (non-conceptualized) sensation. In the case of vision, Eyjólfur Emilsson describes this sort of sensation as a "pure color experience" (1988, 83). Similarly, it would seem, other perceptual and emotional affections may occur on the level of the soul-trace in this way, and it seems clear that these are phenomena of consciousness. While Hutchinson does not discuss these issues in any detail, he finds, in a most interesting passage (49-63), awareness (sunaisthēsis) on the level of the soul-trace and considers its relation to sympathy (sumpatheia). As he explains, Plotinus modifies the Stoic notion of sympathy by dematerializing it in good Platonist fashion. Sympathy "structures a multitude of bodily parts and activities into a unified whole" (56). Awareness (sunaisthēsis), correspondingly, "is the subjective feature that recognizes that the bodily parts and activities that constitute this whole are one's own or belong to oneself" (57). He convincingly argues that this awareness (sunaisthēsis) presents what it recognizes as unified. In this context, he also considers Plotinus' arguments for the unity of consciousness and how Plotinus uses them against materialism. This discussion provides an excellent foundation for future inquiry into the question of how this sort of unified experience is possible on the level of (non-conceptualized) sensation.

The lower soul is the level of the soul where our discursive reasoning and the experiences we are familiar with from our daily lives occur. Unlike the soul-trace, it is rational. The lower soul becomes aware of sensible and of intelligible objects by means of phantasiai -- a term that Hutchinson translates as "images". The usual translation "representation" (or "presentation") would in my view have been preferable because phantasiai are propositionally structured. The corresponding cognitive act is apprehension. Phantasiai normally are, Hutchinson states, self-intimating in the sense that, when they occur, the subject automatically apprehends them and is in this sense conscious of them (72-73). Due to the distinction between higher soul, lower soul, and soul-trace and due to the fact that the lower soul is only conscious of what it apprehends, there are psychic occurrences that are, in a sense, sub-conscious (for the lower soul). This happens when they occur on the other two levels without being apprehended. For example, I am conscious of a pain in my living body only when I apprehend it.

Self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis), in the sense of second-order awareness, too, occurs on the level of the lower soul even though it does not always accompany first order awareness. Hutchinson discusses the famous passage Enn. I.4.10.21-33 where Plotinus states: "The reader is not necessarily conscious that he is reading, least of all when he is reading with intensity." When one is reading attentively, being aware of one's reading would be a distraction. It would seem that this passage reveals that Plotinus, while acknowledging the fact that there is self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis), considers it a phenomenon that only occurs when one is not completely absorbed in one's activity and when one is not completely focused on the task at hand. It would thus seem that self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis) is absent when a soul or intellect is completely absorbed in their excellent activity of contemplation. For Plotinus continues: "But when these [activities] are alone then they are pure, more active, and more alive" (ibid.). However, Hutchinson warns us that the example of reading should not be taken to indicate that Plotinus "does not rate self-consciousness highly" (116). Hutchinson does so because self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis) occurs also on the level of intellect, whose perfection would not allow for self-consciousness if self-consciousness weakened its focus on its object. Thus, to solve this problem, Hutchinson argues that Plotinus' claim that cognition is weakened by self-consciousness only applies to the lower soul. While Hutchinson points to a real problem, the passage he discusses does not in my view warrant such an interpretation. Perhaps another solution is preferable. To examine this further, let us turn to the self-consciousness of the intellect.

Plotinus endorses Aristotle's identification of intellect, intellection, and intelligible object (Enn. V.3.5). However, unlike Aristotle, Plotinus also states that the intellect has self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis). Hutchinson discusses Enn. II.9.1 where Plotinus argues that the intellect, in thinking itself, is self-conscious and thinks that it thinks (interpreting Aristotle's famous "thinking of thinking" (noēsis noēseōs)). However, Plotinus also insists that this is part of its primary thinking (and thus not a distinct second-order awareness). Developing further an idea by Emilsson (2007, 110-113), Hutchinson explains: "Plotinus employs parakolouthēsis in these two passages [Enn. II.9.1.34-47 and III.9.9.13-25] because he is contrasting Intellect with the One by showing that thinking that one is thinking involves a duality, which is absent from the One" (136). The duality in question is one of intellect and its object. If I understand him correctly, Hutchinson is arguing that consciousness is built into the intellect's thinking: by thinking its object, with which it is identical, the intellect not only contemplates itself but is also conscious of itself. I find this convincing. It explains why self-consciousness on the level of intellect does not weaken the intellect's focus on its object: self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis) is no longer a second-order awareness on this level. However, in consequence, it seems to me, the term "parakolouthēsis" is used in a different sense on the level of lower soul than on that of intellect -- a systematic ambiguity of the kind we find in many areas of Plotinus' philosophy. This, I think, solves the problem discussed above: Parakolouthēsis as second-order awareness does indeed weaken cognitive activity, wherever it occurs, but parakolouthēsis as self-consciousness on the level of intellect is not a second-order awareness. Instead, the intellect is aware of itself by having itself as the object of its contemplation -- a contemplation of which consciousness is an integral part.

Not only self-consciousness (parakolouthēsis) but also awareness (sunaisthēsis) occurs in the intellect. The object of the intellect's contemplation is manifold; it is the world of Forms. Plotinus describes the intellect's awareness (sunaisthēsis) as "the awareness of a whole when many parts come together into the same thing. This occurs when something thinks itself, which in fact is thinking in the primary sense" (Enn. V.3.13.12-14). Hutchinson emphasizes that the same term is used both here and for the lower-level unified awareness of bodily parts and activities. Since also the lower soul experiences the world as unified, awareness (sunaisthēsis) occurs on all three levels (41). It would be interesting to study whether the term "awareness" (sunaisthēsis) is used, as Hutchinson assumes, in the same sense on all three levels or whether it is used in different senses, in analogy to what I suspect is the case with parakolouthēsis. It at least seems possible, and perhaps even plausible, that what it means for the trace to be aware of body parts in a unified way is quite different from what it means for an intellect to be aware of intelligible objects in a unified way. For both the subject and the object of awareness on the level of the trace are relevantly distinct from the corresponding subject and object on the level of the intellect; they are distinct in both their being and their unity.

Thanks to its clarification of the distinction between apprehension, consciousness, and awareness and its systematic exploration of these phenomena in the context of Plotinus' theories of soul and intellect, the book is a valuable contribution to Plotinus scholarship and will be of interest to any student of ancient philosophy and of the history of the philosophy of consciousness.


Armstrong, D. M. (1980). The Nature of Mind and Other Essays. Ithaca: Cornell University Press.

Caluori, D. (2015). Plotinus on the Soul. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Emilsson, E. K. (1988). Plotinus on Sense-Perception: A Philosophical Study. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Emilsson , E. K. (2007). Plotinus on Intellect. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schwyzer, H. R. (1960). Bewusst und Unbewusst bei Plotin. Les sources de Plotin. Geneva: Fondation Hardt, 341-377.