Plotinus on Intellect

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Eyjólfur Kjalar Emilsson, Plotinus on Intellect, Oxford University Press, 2007, 232pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199281701.

Reviewed by Suzanne Stern-Gillet, University of Bolton


Plotinian studies are currently flourishing: two entirely new translations of the whole corpus into French (Garnier-Flammarion and Les Belles-Lettres) are under way, commentaries on individual tractates are coming out thick and fast in English, French and Italian, and articles on various aspects of the Enneads regularly appear in an ever increasing number of specialised journals.  To this growing body of literature, E.K. Emilsson's Plotinus on Intellect is a most valuable addition.  It addresses a main question in Plotinus' ontology, and it does so in the language of philosophy.  Rather than remaining locked within the intricacies of Plotinus' system, in the manner of many a scholar working in the field, Emilsson (henceforth E.) is not afraid to stand back from the system, to ask basic, seemingly elementary, questions of it and, by way of cautious borrowings from modern philosophy, to work out answers that make it sound less rebarbative than it might at first appear to non-specialists.  While E. is much to be congratulated for so seeking to extend Plotinus' appeal to a wider philosophical readership, it yet needs to be noted that, as will be seen below, Plotinus on Intellect is a book with a thesis, a thesis that is consistently used as an exegetical hypothesis in the central chapters (II and III) of his book.  The thesis itself and its varied ramifications are painstakingly and lucidly argued for, and if E.'s occasional reliance on the tools and concepts of later philosophies will strike some of his readers as anachronistic, it does not generally impair the interpretive rigour with which he approaches the text of Plotinus.  Extensive quotations from the Enneads are given in Armstrong's rendering (often modified), with the original text in the editio minor (H.S.2) being provided in footnotes.  References are to Porphyry's ordering of the tractates, with no more than an occasional nod to the chronological order of writing.  There is a preponderance of quotations from V.3[49] (On the Knowing Hypostases and That Which is Beyond).

Chapter I is devoted to the very core of Plotinus' ontology, namely, the notion of emanation and the theoretical underpinning that it receives from the theory of double activity.  In Plotinus' interpretation of this theory, each of the three hypostases has an internal and an external activity.  Internal activity is that which belongs to it by virtue of its own essence while external activity is that which necessarily follows from its internal activity.  While the former is self-contained, the latter results in a product that is other than the agent itself.  Thus, for instance, while the activity of the One is absolute in the sense of not being directed to anything other than itself, it none the less involves a process of overflowing which causes the being of something that is other than it.  Although E. devotes a large section of this chapter to a discussion of the much debated issue of the origin, Aristotelian and/or Platonic, of Plotinus' conception of double activity, his main concern is with the conception of agency that is presupposed in it.  Is Plotinus, E. wonders, consistent in holding that an act can be self-contained while yet resulting in a product that is external to the agent?  The contradiction is more apparent than real, replies E., who argues that in Plotinus' non-teleological concept of activity, the internal and the external activity of a principle are not separate exertions of the same agent.  Taking the example of walking in the snow and making a trace in it, he claims that although walking is the cause of making a trace, making a trace is not an exertion (or activity) separate from the exertion (or activity) of walking.  In that example, as in Plotinus' emanative ontology, the internal and the external activity have identical causes and effects.

In chapter II, E. addresses a number of problems concerning the genesis and nature of Intellect, both in its inchoate and in its fully converted state: Why is the product of the One an Intellect?  Why does the inchoate Intellect convert at all?  Does the inchoate Intellect see the One or merely an image of the One?  Why does Plotinus postulate a pre-noetic experience of the One?  Does the plurality of intelligibles or forms in Intellect follow from the duality of subject and object that marks its thinking?  Is Plotinus' occasional description of Intellect's apprehension of the One in terms of touch or similar metaphors of direct contact fully consistent with the vocabulary of otherness that he mostly uses to characterise the mode of operation of the actual Intellect?  Although all these questions receive an answer in the course of the chapter, the lion's share of the argument is taken up with an explanation of the manner in which plurality and diversity come to Intellect, a topic on which Plotinus seems to have reserved his best thoughts to himself.  With the exception of Ham (2000), who mainly concentrates on the textual difficulties in V.3.10 and 13, most recent commentators have followed Plotinus' lead in cautiously steering clear of the issue.  To explain how the duality of subject and object and the multiplicity of intelligibles are brought together in the self-thinking of Intellect, E. turns to the small number of passages in which Plotinus ascribes to Intellect first-person singular statements of the form 'I am F'.  In those self-identifying statements Intellect 'asserts its identity or essential character' (p. 117) and is, by definition, aware of itself as doing so.  Since Intellect constitutes itself in the very act of thinking, any 'I' that it utters necessarily denotes a thinking thing.  Furthermore, since this thinking thing is also the object of its thought, and since Intellect is, by definition, aware of it being such, the first otherness that enters Plotinus' ontology is the duality of subject and object.  The second otherness arises from the impossibility of thinking 'I' as an undifferentiated entity, an impossibility which is inherent in the very nature of thought, be that of Intellect or of any other thinker.  This means that in identifying itself as, e.g., F, Intellect is also differentiating itself from what it is not.  The duality between subject and object in the self-thought of Intellect, therefore, necessarily entails ontological plurality and diversity.  In E.'s own words, a self-thinking entity 'must in order to think itself at all think what it itself is not, since this brings about the complexity involved in a thing and its negation.  Thus, complexity is a presupposition of the thought which unifies the subject which thinks itself with its object, i.e. itself.' (p. 88).  Eternally thinking itself, Intellect, though diverse, constitutes itself as a hen polla and thus achieves the second-best kind of unity possible.

Is E.'s account of diversity in Intellect as convincing as it is ingenious?  Although the worries that I have about it are not insurmountable, they are serious worries none the less.  First, Emilsson's Plotinus bears a suspicious resemblance to the Oxonian Descartes of my youth, as a mere glance at the accounts of the cogito provided by Ayer, Williams and their various successors would confirm.  Emilsson, as we know, is unconcerned by the anachronism involved in presenting Plotinus as a proto-Cartesian, but not everyone shares his insouciance.  Secondly, E.'s interpretation crucially depends upon such first-person statements as Plotinus imagines Intellect uttering.  But is there any evidence that these statements are anything other than a literary device on Plotinus' part, a literary device that he uses rather sparingly?  Thirdly, in unravelling what he considers to have been Plotinus' views on the matter, E. cannot avoid rendering the self-thought of Intellect into concepts and, indeed, statements.  How is the thought 'I am F', which E. repeatedly ascribes to Intellect, to be interpreted if not as the ascription of a quality to a subject?  Can this be squared with Plotinus' distinction between noêsis and theôria and his explicit claim, as expressed, for instance, in V.8[31]. 6, that the thinking of Intellect is 'all together in one' (athroon) and not conducted through discourse (dianoêsis)?  Happily, E. is not unaware of this particular problem and goes some way to addressing it in the fourth chapter of his book.  Fourthly, E.'s conviction that the thought of Intellect is conducted from the first-person standpoint leads him to ascribe to Plotinus a mild version of Descartes' thesis according to which the human mind is transparent to itself.  This leads him, in turn, to contradict a number of Plotinian statements to the contrary.  Thus when E. writes that for Plotinus '… mundane [states of mind] normally include a consciousness of one being in these states', he is putting forward a view that Plotinus rejects in no uncertain terms in such well-known passages as I.4 [46].10 and IV.3 [15].30.

Chapter III has E. leisurely exploring a number of philosophical issues concerning the relationship between cognition and its objects.  Foremost amongst them is the question as to whether Plotinus' description of the intelligibles as internal to Intellect -- and of their activity as identical with that of Intellect -- commits him to a form of idealism.  By means of a long detour that takes in the contrast between Plotinus' version of perceptual realism and his internalist account of the mode of cognition of Intellect, E. is led cautiously to conclude, pace Burnyeat (1982), that Plotinus is 'a kind of idealist after all' (p. 174).  While sense-perception consists in an external object affecting the sense-organ, in the case of intellectual cognition the object of cognition is internal to, and identical with, the thinking agent.  From this the idealist conclusion follows that in Intellect the mode of cognition determines the nature of the object.  Although long, E.'s detour through the intricacies of Plotinus' account of sense-perception is interesting, perhaps not so much for the contribution that it makes to the overall argument of the chapter, but mainly for the opportunity that it provides him of revisiting some of the territory that he had covered in his 1988 book, Plotinus on Sense-Perception.  The account of sense-perception given here shows E. at his best: while introducing some amendments and nuances to his 1988 account, he argues afresh for the overall coherence of Plotinus' theory of perception.  Passages in the corpus which seem at first blush to contain evidence of a representationalist conception of sense perception are better interpreted, so E. argues persuasively, in terms of the distinction between images (eikasiai) and real beings (ta onta).

In chapter IV, E. investigates a topic that has not received much critical attention of late, namely, the distinction between 'ordinary inferential or discursive thought … and the kind of thought characteristic of Intellect that is non-discursive or, as it is sometimes called, intuitive.' (p. 176).  The bulk of the chapter is devoted to the nature of Intellect's thought.  'Is the thought of Intellect propositional or not?', E. wonders, before outlining the views of Lloyd (1970 and 1986), who held that it was not, and of Sorabji (1982), who held that it was.  In disagreement with both views, E. argues at length, on the basis of a close analysis of the passages concerned, that the thought of Intellect is unified yet complex, but that its complexity does not entail that it is 'structured in the manner of propositions' (p. 198).  Some readers will find this chapter the weakest of the book, on the ground that the nature of propositions remains a disputed topic among contemporary philosophers, that E. never fully explains either what exactly he understands by 'proposition' or how he conceives of the relation between the conceptual and the propositional, and, finally, that the distinction between sentences and propositions is not a distinction that Plotinus knew or anticipated.  Such criticisms would not be wholly justified in so far as E.'s close reading of texts often leads the reader to ponder anew the meaning of Plotinus' notoriously obscure pronouncements on the thinking of Intellect.  This is particularly so when, returning to a topic he knows best, E. draws a helpful parallel between perceptual and intellectual vision: just as sight grasps its manifold object in its spatial interrelatedness and in a manner that is direct and non-representational, so does Intellect apprehend the intelligibles 'all together' and in a way that is both 'unmediated by language and other proxies' (p. 191), and holistic in the sense that knowledge of a part is also knowledge of the whole and knowledge of the whole informs knowledge of each of its parts.  Yet, although unmediated by language and non-propositional, the thinking of Intellect, in E,'s view, is none the less 'definitely conceptual' since 'its objects, the intelligibles, are something of the order of concepts' (p. 198).  At the close of this chapter, one would have liked E. to use the insights gained in his painstaking reflections on propositions, discursiveness and conceptual thought to revisit the thesis on the first-person nature of Intellect's thought that he introduced in chapter II.  Disappointingly, this is not so, and chapter IV, for all the riches that it offers, ends up on a somewhat inconclusive note.

Plotinus on Intellect is a well-produced book: typos are rare, references accurate and indices helpfully comprehensive.  Although it makes heavy demands on its readers and occasionally taxes their patience, it yet is a fine work which deserves to become a point of reference for anyone working in the field.