Plotinus on Number

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Svetla Slaveva-Griffin, Plotinus on Number, Oxford UP, 2009, 176pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195377194.

Reviewed by Frans A. J. de Haas, Leiden University



Plotinus on Number offers a comprehensive analysis of Plotinus’ concept of number, together with its origins in Plato and the Neopythagoreans, and its influence on Porphyry. The focus of the book is Plotinus’ treatise on number, Enneads VI.6 34. Furthermore, as Slaveva-Griffin rightly emphasizes, in the case of Plotinus the interpretation of a single treatise should always be related to his philosophy as a whole, and throughout the book she remains true to this principle. Slaveva-Griffin deals with her sometimes intractable subject with remarkable ease and clarity, and she is in full command of the relevant literature, both ancient and modern. Her bibliography shows that Plotinus’ discussion of the foundations of arithmetic has perhaps been better served by modern scholarship than she suggests, although this book is probably the first full-length discussion of the treatise available in English. Her treatment of Plotinus builds on, e.g., Bertier e.a. (1980), Charles-Saget (1982) 105-185, Horn (1995) 149-288, and Nikulin (1998)1, but corrects and supplements their accounts in important ways.

In Enn. VI.6 34 Plotinus develops a hierarchy of number with his first principle, the One, presiding as the cause of all number. As such, it precedes so-called essential or substantial number (ousiôdes arithmos), which is found at the level of Intellect, Plotinus’ second hypostasis. Substantial number counts as the activity (energeia) of being, as well as the power (dunamis) that divides the realm of intelligible being into the limited number of Forms. Not only does substantial number correspond to being as its activity, but it can be studied from the angle of each of the five genera of Plato’s Sophist, i.e., in addition to being, rest, movement, sameness, and otherness. In Plotinus, these five genera structure the intelligible realm (see Enn. VI.2 43).

Slaveva-Griffin convincingly argues, against Horn and others, that rest corresponds to ‘unified number’ (arithmos hênômenos), movement to ‘number moving itself’ (arithmos en heautôi kinoumenos), otherness to ‘unfolded number’ (arithmos exelêligmenos), and sameness to ‘encompassing number’ (arithmos periechôn). In geometrical terms, substantial number thus represents the series: point — line — circle — sphere. Among these kinds of substantial number we recognize Speusippus’ definition of soul as ‘moving number’, and the ‘complete living being’ that encompasses all kinds of being, from Plato’s Timaeus. Slaveva-Griffin devotes an important and highly informative first chapter to the relation of Plotinus’ treatise to the Timaeus (pp. 24-41, cf. 83-4, 107-112).

None of these kinds of number, however, is the number that is used in arithmetic and in everyday counting. Whereas substantial number determines the existence of multiplicity in the intelligible realm, it has a material copy or image, so-called monadic number (monadikos arithmos), which expresses quantitatively that which has already been defined by substantial number in the intelligible realm. At the same time monadic number saves sensible multiplicity from dissipation in infinity, and thus performs an important cosmological function. The third hypostasis, Soul, which is the image of Intellect, possesses all properties of substantial number, which enables it to encompass the sphere of the universe. The individual soul expresses the non-quantitative substantial numbers in quantitative monadic numbers. Hence, mathematics and the numerability of individual things rely on monadic number. Here we recognize the Neopythagorean distinction between the monad as the first principle of numbers, and arithmetical number as the principle of enumerated things, found in Moderatus. Interestingly, Slaveva-Griffin argues (pp. 46-52) that Moderatus rather than Nicomachus was Plotinus’ main Neopythagorean influence, esp. Moderatus’ definition of number as a motion of progression and regression of multiplicity (fr. 1, 2-3).

Plotinus does seem to have realized that this array of numbers is particularly baffling, especially since its details draw on different Neopythagorean and Platonic sources, and owes much to detailed criticism of Peripatetic and Stoic views of number. Therefore he gave his treatise a particular form that is remarkably suited to convey its complicated message. Slaveva-Griffin provides an original and full exposition of this structure. Plotinus has designed his treatise as a symmetrical and self-contained whole of concentric circles (figure 1 on p. 21). The first chapter of Enn. VI.6 defines multiplicity and infinity. Chapters 2 and 3 defend Plato’s infinite number (Parm. 142b-145a) against Aristotle’s criticisms (Metaph. 1083a-1084a, cf. Phys. III.4-8). Chapters 4-8 reveal the dominant role of number in the intelligible as summarized above. Chapter 9 is the core of the treatise, and the centre of the circle: it outlines the participation of number in every intelligible entity, and thus displays the cohesive power of number throughout all levels of the universe, issuing from the single centre of number, as it were. Chapters 10-16 refute other aspects of Aristotle’s polemics on number. With chapter 17 we return to the earlier topic of the number of infinity, while chapter 18 investigates how multiplicity ascends to the One, thus moving into the opposite direction of multiplicity’s descent in chapter 1. As Slaveva-Griffin puts it: “As multiplicity unfolds from the One and enfolds to the One, so does the composition unfold and enfold itself like nesting circles, moving away from and yet turning toward their center” (p. 20). From this insight into the unity of thought and writing Slaveva-Griffin develops an interesting interpretation of Porphyry’s ordering of Plotinus’ works in six sets of nine, as monadic numbers conveying, albeit faintly, the organization of Plotinus’ universe (ch. 6).

One aspect of Enn. VI.6 that is curiously missing from Slaveva-Griffin ‘s book is Plotinus’ careful and lengthy reply to the objection that the one and the unit have no real existence but are mere affections of the soul. Throughout Enn. VI.6 34 12-15 (which do not figure in Slaveva-Griffin ‘s index locorum at all) Plotinus examines the relationship between the generation of universal concepts of ’number’ and ‘multiplicity’, and (intelligible) reality. Here Slaveva-Griffin might have found further confirmation of Plotinus’ creativity in restructuring the Platonic, Peripatetic and Stoic heritage.

All in all, this book is a rewarding study of important aspects of Plotinus philosophy as a whole, and an indispensable tool for anyone interested in Enn. VI.6 34 and the mathematical strand in ancient Platonism.

1 Bertier, J., L. Brisson, A. Charles, J. Pépin, H. D. Saffrey, and A.-P. Segonds (1980), Plotin. Traité sur les nombres (Ennéade VI 6 34), Paris, Vrin; Charles-Saget, A. (1982), L’architecture du divin: mathématique et philosophie chez Plotin et Proclus, Paris; Horn, C. (1995), Plotin über Sein, Zahl und Einheit: eine Studie zu den systematischen Grundlagen der Enneaden, Beiträge zur Altertumskunde, Stuttgart, Teubner; Nikulin, D.V. (1998), "Foundations of Arithmetic in Plotinus: Enn. VI.6 34 on the Structure and the Constitution of Number", Methexis 11, 85-102.