Plotinus on Self: The Philosophy of the 'We'

Placeholder book cover

Pauliina Remes, Plotinus on Self: The Philosophy of the 'We', Cambridge University Press, 2008, 287pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521867290.

Reviewed by James Wilberding, University of Newcastle upon Tyne


One's 'self,' like one's 'true love,' might seem prima facie to be the kind of term whose very meaning demands its own uniqueness. Of course we can speak of someone having 'another (and another) true love,' but we can't do so without diminishing the sense of the phrase. Used often enough one might suspect that it refers to nothing more than someone whom one really likes or desires. So what are we to make of someone like Plotinus who suggests that each one of us has two selves -- an embodied self and an immaterial self? This is the question that Remes sets out to tackle in her recent book, in which she aims to demonstrate that Plotinus does have a coherent and unified conception of the self that has an important role to play in his metaphysics, epistemology and ethics. This is a rich book that discusses far more than could be covered in a single review, and in what follows I shall focus on what I take to be some of its central theses on the unity of selfhood.

In fact, although Remes is for the most part content to follow Plotinus' practice of engaging in a 'two-dimensional discussion of selfhood' (10), she distinguishes as many as five senses of 'self' in the Enneads (240) -- (i) the embodied self, (ii) selfhood as a process in time, (iii) discursive reason, (iv) pure intellect, and (v) 'that capable of identifying itself with any of these senses' -- and ultimately does a very impressive job of constructing a unified theory that displays the connections between all of them. (i) The embodied self is not merely the body but the composite including the vegetative, sensitive and even the rational power of soul. The first chapter of the book, which appeared previously in Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, is devoted to forming an account of the diachronic identity and unity of this embodied self. Remes argues that the embodied self is a self in time. Since this composite self involves a body, it is in flux and a mere 'quasi-substance' (34), yet it nevertheless remains the same self on account of the soul that belongs to it (39). Drawing an expression from 3.7.11, Remes characterizes the embodied self as being 'one in continuity,' which is to say that it is a unity that consists of parts. More specifically, she argues that this embodied self is best understood as a kind of four-dimensional whole consisting of temporal parts. Describing a 3rd century philosopher as a four-dimensionalist is bound to strike some as irredeemably anachronistic, but, as Remes shows, Plotinus' views on the relationship obtaining between the sensible and intelligible worlds provide good reasons for understanding the unity of composite living things in this manner. After all, Plotinus repeatedly says that the composite sensible world contains everything that is in the intelligible world, but this only makes sense if we understand the sensible world to be a four-dimensional whole, since there is no one time at which it contains the entire contents of the intelligible world. This interpretation of the identity of sensible particulars allows Remes to conclude that (i) the embodied self is in fact (ii) 'a process in time,' and that this is the self that allows us to speak of self-improvement. This ethical upshot shows that the changes attached to the embodied self involve much more than just material flux and include personal histories, aspirations and thoughts:

[T]he embodied self is deeply personal. For this self, the contingently and personally constructed past is a real aspect of selfhood … Similarly the future developments of the embodied self belong to the whole process of its lifetime, of its selfhood in time. (56)

There are, however, problems with this embodied self. Above all else it lacks completion. This follows firstly from the above: since it is a 'process' self, there is no time at which it is wholly present, and of course it ultimately perishes. But it also follows from Remes' conclusions regarding the relationship that holds between particular human beings and their intelligible paradigms. Forms, she argues, 'consist of something like logical parts' (71). The Form of Human Being, for example, contains (non-spatial) parts that together account for all the 'possibilities within the form of human being' (81). That is to say, the Form contains potentially within itself all the form-principles or logoi that account for the way human beings are, including 'rationality, life and eyes' (71) but also much less generic logoi -- not just of nose but of snub-nose and aquiline nose (79). In this way Remes provides a very reasonable solution to the much-debated issue in Plotinian scholarship concerning the Forms of Individuals. There is no need to posit Forms of Individuals in order to account for the intelligibility of an individual such as Socrates: Socrates' embodied individuality is due to a certain bundle of logoi -- a 'rational pattern' (81) that represents one possible instantiation of the Form of Human Being. Thus the embodied self -- even over a lifetime -- can only instantiate a fraction of what is contained in the Form. As such it is essentially incomplete (90).

For completion we must turn from the embodied self to the immaterial self, which Remes refers to by a number of expressions: the 'rational' or 'reflective' self (11), 'pure rational soul' (157) or the 'pure rational subject' (111) etc., and all of these refer to the undescended soul, which is (iv) one's pure intellect. This might confuse some who are accustomed to thinking of reason in Plotinus solely as (iii) discursive reason. For Remes argues that we should think of rationality as being 'divided into two parts: into the perfect paradigm and thereby the truest self, nous, as well as into its temporal and erring counterpart, discursive reasoning, dianoia, residing in the composite' (157). The argument basically amounts to showing that intellect and discursive reasoning are not engaged in radically different activities, rather there are important similarities in function and content. Both are essentially engaged in the activities of collection and division -- establishing and organizing the similarities and differences of the objects they encounter. Likewise, although the intellect is dealing with Forms and the discursive reason with logoi, the latter obviously derive from the former. And since discursive reason is the definitive power of the embodied self, it follows that the two selves -- the embodied self and the true intellectual self -- far from being utterly distinct are in fact related to each other in important ways, as the former is derived from and explained by the latter. Moreover, both are capable of self-awareness (sunaisthêsis), which in each case amounts to a unifying awareness of a multiplicity that one identifies oneself with, and this is ultimately what makes them into selves, since self just is a 'unitary centre of awareness' (126). And this leads us once again to the conclusion that the embodied self is essentially deficient, since it involves a kind of manifold that can never be truly unified. It cannot collect all of its spatial and temporal parts into a single awareness, and so falls short of achieving true selfhood. In addition, the awareness that the embodied self does have of itself lacks certainty since, as Plotinus famously argues against the skeptics, the conditio sine qua non for certainty is the identity of subject and object -- a condition that only obtains in the case of the intellect. Thus, for the intellect alone is this awareness an 'epistemically indubitable activity' (110), and this again would seem to compromise the embodied self's claim to selfhood, since the self would seem to be the one thing that has the strongest claim to being a secure object of knowledge.

If this demonstration of the similarities and relations between the embodied rational self and intellect does much to stitch together Plotinus' two notions of self, a final rupture is threatened by his own exhortation that we separate ourselves from our embodied existence. It has been suggested that this notorious insistence on separation drives a wedge between Plotinian ethics and what most would agree to be a central ethical issue, namely being genuinely concerned for the well-being of others. After all, why direct my attention to others' embodied selves if I'm supposed to distance myself from my own? Here, then, we have the familiar problem of the tension between the contemplative and practical lives, and in the final chapters of her book, which include material from a previous article that appeared in the Journal of the History of Philosophy, Remes adds her voice to a growing number of scholars (Schniewind, O'Meara) who argue that the Plotinian sage does not ultimately amount to anything like a detached, weltfremd philosopher who has no concern for the goings-on in the cave, though interestingly Remes concedes that this might be the case for some Plotinian sages (226).

All in all, Plotinus on Self offers a very comprehensive and thoughtful exploration of Plotinus' entire philosophy. It is a very welcome addition to Plotinus scholarship.