Plotinus the Platonist: A Comparative Account of Plato and Plotinus' Metaphysics

Placeholder book cover

David J. Yount, Plotinus the Platonist: A Comparative Account of Plato and Plotinus' Metaphysics, Bloomsbury, 2014, 262pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472575210.

Reviewed by Damian Caluori, Trinity University


In this book, David J. Yount defends the claim that Plotinus' and Plato's metaphysical views do "not essentially differ" (ix). To make his point, he introduces the "compatibility principle," (CP) which he describes as follows:

Plato['s] and Plotinus' views are compatible or consistent in principle if Plotinus (or Plato) writes on some subject that does not appear in Plato (or Plotinus), unless there is written evidence in a particular case that one author writes something to the effect that 'A is true' and the other author writes that 'A is false' (xxviii).

As Yount explains, even if, for obvious historical reasons, there is no evidence about Plato's view on Gnosticism, Plotinus' taking a stance against Gnosticism does not imply that Plotinus' and Plato's metaphysical views differ. Now even if we can show that there is no passage in either Plato or Plotinus to the effect that the Platonic passage affirms what the Plotinian passage denies or vice versa, CP will not be sufficient to prove that Plotinus' and Plato's views are essentially the same. Conceding this, Yount states that "This principle will merely show that the onus is on my opponent to show where the two philosophers essentially differ" (xxix). I am unconvinced that CP will be sufficient for this job either. For let us grant that Plotinus' philosophy is largely based on sophisticated and illuminating interpretations of Plato such that it is indeed compatible with Plato's text; there are many non-Plotinian interpretations of Plato's work that, while being inconsistent with Plotinus' interpretation, are consistent with what Plato says. Hence, a defender of Plotinus' interpretation must do more to back up the claim that Plotinus' interpretation is more convincing than alternative interpretations that are also consistent with Plato's text.

Yount claims "that Plotinus' central views on metaphysics . . . come to him as a result of having what will be termed here 'ultimate experience', and not primarily as a result of his culture, his place in history, or his reading some or all of the Stoics', or Aristotle's, works" (xxix). Yount adds that his contention is "unprovable" (xxx). Now Plato's influence on Plotinus can be clearly seen from all the passages that Yount compares in his book. Yet if we understand Plotinus as an interpreter of Plato, I do not see any need for, or advantage in, also ascribing to him an ultimate experience.

Yount states: "I will not only ignore similarities between Plotinus' view and that of Aristotle, I will also ignore the similarities between Plotinus' view and the views of Pythagoreans, Stoics, and Gnostics" (xxix). In particular ignoring Aristotle and the Stoics seems to me to be problematic from a methodological point of view. In his Life of Plotinus Porphyry reports: "His [i.e. Plotinus'] writings, however, are full of concealed Stoic and Peripatetic doctrines. Aristotle's Metaphysics, in particular, is concentrated in them." (VP 14, tr. Armstrong). Porphyry's point is important. For example, I do not think there is any reason to doubt that Plotinus' view of the identity of subject and object of intellection is based on Aristotle (Metaph. 1072b21). Moreover, I do not see how we can deny the influence of such post-Hellenistic philosophers as Alexander of Aphrodisias and Numenius that are also ignored by Yount. The Enneads provide us with detailed discussions of such sources as can be seen from the index fontium in Henry-Schwyzer. If we want to understand Plotinus as a Platonist, we need to study in detail, it seems to me, not only how he defends Platonism against Aristotle, the Stoics and others but also how he absorbs views and uses arguments from sources outside of Plato's work.

Yount's book consists of six chapters, each discussing a topic considered central to the metaphysics of Plato and Plotinus. He attempts to show that both Plato and Plotinus held the views discussed in each chapter.

The aim of Chapter 1 is to show that the Good is identical to the One in both Plato and Plotinus and that it is the first principle of everything. While it is quite uncontroversial that Plotinus identifies the One and the Good and considers it the first principle, these two claims are much more controversial, of course, in the case of Plato. Yount rightly emphasizes that in Republic 509b the Good is not only said to be beyond being but also to be not being (ouk ousias ontos tou agathou all'eti epekeina tēs ousias). Like many ancient Platonists, Yount identifies this point with one made in the first hypothesis of Plato's Parmenides, where the One (that is, the subject matter of the first hypothesis) is shown to be without being. While this is a valid observation, it does not prove that the two passages refer to the same item also according to Plato. For Yount's argument already presupposes a specific interpretation of the Parmenides. The arguments of the second part of the Parmenides are explicitly called an exercise (gymnasia) in Plato's text (Parm. 135d7), and we already know from Proclus (In Parm. 630-635) that some ancient interpreters understood the second part of the Parmenides as an exercise in logic rather than a treatise in metaphysics -- a view still held by some contemporary interpreters. Whether or not these interpreters are right, the example illustrates that we must go beyond CP if we want to defend a Plotinian interpretation of Plato.

In Chapter 2, Yount argues that Plato and Plotinus agree that the Good is not identical with Beauty; that both believe that Beauty is a form; that the vision of Beauty is considered transformative by both and that they both believe that the imitator of Beauty does not know whether her imitations are beautiful. I will only comment on the first of these claims. Yount discusses the problem that Plotinus in different treatises appears to say different things about the relation of the Good to Beauty, seemingly identifying them in Enn. I.6.6, implicitly denying identity in Enn. V.8.9 (by identifying Beauty and Being), and explicitly denying identity in Enn. V.5.12. These passages are interesting and call for detailed interpretation that ideally would allow us to see that the inconsistencies are not real but only apparent. Yount comments:

Taken together, the most promising reading of these passages is to interpret Plotinus as claiming that there is a Form Beauty, which is what the nature of Beauty is; the Good is beautiful, but the Good itself is not the nature of what beauty is . . . ; the Intellectual, or Living, Principle is beautiful as well, but, again, is not Beauty itself; and Beauty is not the One or the First . . . (55).

While Yount holds on to the view that Beauty is a Form in Plotinus, he leaves somewhat unexplained the other passages he cites. For example, how is it possible for the Good to be beautiful if it is the One and thus, at least in Plotinus' view, without attributes? I would think that it cannot participate in the Form of Beauty. If Yount thinks it can, this would need to be explained, and if he thinks it cannot then we need an explanation as to how it can be beautiful without participating in the Form of Beauty. The questions raised by Yount in this chapter are intriguing and invite further investigation.

Chapter 3 is devoted to Intellect, more specifically to the following claims: Intellect is identical to Being; Intellect has intelligence, wisdom, life, soul; God is the creator and wise; the gods exist, are mindful of humans and cannot be swayed from justice; the Demiurge is alternatively Intellect, God or Creator; the Sophist's greatest kinds are the greatest kinds also in Plotinus. While I am unconvinced by some of the claims made in this chapter, I will focus on Yount's discussion of the Demiurge that I find convincing. Yount shows that both Plato and Plotinus defend the view that there is a divine Craftsman who creates the (sensible) world. While it is uncontroversial that Plato's Timaeus makes this point, scholars disagree on whether also Plotinus believes in the existence of a Craftsman. With reference to such passages as Enn. IV.4.10 and Enn. V.8.8 Yount argues in favor of a Plotinian Craftsman. In these passages Plotinus explicitly agrees with what is stated about the Craftsman's existence and creative activity in the Timaeus. Yount states: "it stands to reason that God [i.e. the Craftsman] already has everything worked out when creating the universe. There is no notion . . . of the Demiurge's having to deliberate and figure out what would be the best for the universe" (89). Thus, Plotinus' denying that the Craftsman deliberates and figures things out does not, as is often thought, show that Plotinus also denies his existence or his role as creator.

Chapter 4 deals with the All-Soul or World-Soul. It is argued (on behalf of Plato and Plotinus) that the All-Soul must exist; that it has Intellect as its source; that it circles, contemplates and knows Intellect; that it has an upper part that circles around Intellect and that its lower phases are individual souls; that it is in time. As far as Plotinus is concerned, Yount does not, in this chapter, clearly distinguish between hypostasis Soul and World-Soul -- a distinction that would have been helpful. Some of the claims made about the All-Soul in this chapter seem to me to better fit the hypostasis Soul (only discussed in the next chapter). For example, that the World-Soul (rather than the hypostasis Soul) has Intellect as its source and individual souls as its parts will at least be controversial and would need discussion. Yount does not explain his preference for attributing this and other properties to the All-Soul rather than to the hypostasis Soul. There are other claims that would need further elucidation. For example, what does it mean for the All-Soul to circle around Intellect?

The three hypostases and emanation are the topics of Chapter 5. Yount challenges the widely held view that Plato and Plotinus differ in that Plotinus, as opposed to Plato, postulates the emanation of lower principles from higher principles. Moreover, Yount argues, as Plotinus and many other ancient Platonists did, that the first three hypotheses of the Parmenides refer to what Platonists took to be the first three hypostases, namely One, Intellect, and hypostasis Soul, respectively. Using CP, Yount argues that understanding the One, subject matter of the third hypothesis, as the third hypostasis is consistent with Plato's and Plotinus' texts. This discussion is valuable because Yount here gives a detailed interpretation of the various claims argued for in the third hypothesis of the Parmenides in terms of souls. Surprisingly, Yount claims towards the end of this section: "I will not argue that the Third Hypothesis of Plato's Parmenides must be taken to be Soul. The issue is whether we are warranted in believing that Plato believes in Three Hypostases" (102). But this is too weak. For assume Yount's argument has succeeded in showing that Plato is committed to the claim that there are three hypostases without having shown that Plato is also committed to the claim that the third hypostasis is the Soul. If the latter has not been shown then, even if there are three hypostases in Plato and in Plotinus, it has not been shown that Plato's and Plotinus' metaphysics essentially agree. The second part of this chapter is devoted to the notion of 'emanation'. Yount convincingly shows that 'emanation' is used by Plotinus as a metaphor and that, as such, it should not be taken to do much explanatory work. In particular, Plotinus' use of this metaphor, even if Plato does not use it, does not as such reveal any substantial differences between Plato and Plotinus.

The final chapter is devoted to matter and evil. Yount argues that for both Plato and Plotinus matter is the Receptacle and evil is deprivation of good. Both claims will be fairly uncontroversial, and the passages Yount cites from both authors show similar arguments that arrive at the same conclusion.

To sum up: Yount convincingly shows that Plotinus was a Platonist. Plotinus' Platonism is largely grounded in Plato's work. Yount cites and compares many passages from Plato's work and from the Enneads that establish this. I am not sure why Yount believes that "[Eyjólfur] Emilsson and I seem to be the only clear proponents of the view that Plotinus is best described as a Platonist" (xxiii). I would think that many scholars agree with that description. The claim, however, that Plato's and Plotinus' metaphysical views are essentially the same is much stronger and much more controversial. The major problem of Yount's project seems to me to be the following. The interpretation of Plotinus is rather controversial; as with many great philosophers, there is no general consensus among interpreters. Yount cites many passages from the Enneads to make his points, but often more elaborate explanations would have been helpful. I think that a detailed interpretation of Plotinus' metaphysics taking into account his debt to Aristotle, to the Stoics, to Numenius, and to others is necessary if we want to understand how Plotinus interpreted Plato and thus how he developed his Platonism. Such a detailed interpretation would also promise to shed further light on many aspects of Plato's thought. Even if we had this, however, we would still not have shown that Plotinus' and Plato's metaphysical views are the same. Yet given the richness and depth of Plato's work, it is, for quite fundamental reasons, hard to see how such a result could ever be achieved.