Placeholder book cover

Eyjólfur K. Emilsson, Plotinus, Routledge, 2017, 410 pp., $35.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780415333498.

Reviewed by Luc Brisson, Centre Jean Pépin (CNRS)


Overall, this work constitutes a general introduction to Plotinus that is pleasant to read and very well informed, by a specialist who has written a great deal on Plotinus. In particular, he is the author of a book on sense perception (1988) and another on the intellect (2007); while with Stephen Strange, he has translated Ennead VI, 4 and VI, 5, On the Presence of Being, One and the Same, Everywhere as a Whole (2015). After a chronology and a brief introduction, the book contains eleven chapters, dealing with the philosophical topics of intellect, soul, physical world, human being, and ethics.  There are also chapters giving background on Plotinus's life, works, and legacy.

The exposition is clear, the argumentation rigorous, and no important Plotinian passage has been overlooked. This makes the book an invaluable resource. At the end of each chapter, there is a summary of the chapter and a list of the primary and secondary sources relevant to it. The book ends with a glossary, a bibliography and a general index. I would add two critical remarks at this juncture. First, one would have liked to have the benefit of an index of passages cited. Second, the bibliography is highly selective, including, for the most part, only titles in English: some indication could have been given of the bibliographical work of Richard Dufour, which continues to be available for free on the internet. Dufour's bibliography cites books and articles in other languages, representing other exegetical cultures. Moreover, the only French translation cited is the one by Bréhier (1924-1938), although a translation under the direction of myself and J.F. Pradeau, which takes international scholarship into account, has recently been published (2002-2010). Finally, the remarkable Spanish translation by Jesús Igal (1982-1998) is not cited either.

With this book, the reader has available a general introduction of very high quality, much more complete than those of Armstrong (1940), Hadot (1963), Rist (1967), O'Meara (1992) and Chiaradonna (2009), which remain works of reference.

Despite these undeniable scientific and pedagogical merits, I will take the opportunity to make a few critical remarks concerning some of its interpretative presuppositions.

The first concerns the reticence adopted toward the Life of Plotinus by Porphyry. To be sure, this text, which, preceded by a portrait, was to have been placed at the beginning of Porphyry's edition of the Enneads, is of course a hagiography, for Plotinus is presented as a master who practices all the virtues perfectly, a kind of incarnate intellect. Nevertheless, it contains much critical information, especially concerning the production of the treatises and their "editing" by Porphyry. One is surprised to find no indication of the treatise's chronological order in the references to the passages cited: a mention of the date of composition of a treatise often enables us to better understand its contents, and, above all, its links to other treatises. We also find practically nothing on Plotinus as an author: his difficulties in expression, his composition techniques, the poor quality of his grammar. The importance of his comparisons, images, and metaphors should have been mentioned, since these allow him to make extraordinary pronouncements on the three "hypostases" that are admirably well-suited and deeply beautiful.

Above all, there is no discussion of the dialogue form of most of the treatises. These treatises reflected the atmosphere of Plotinus' classes. As Porphyry explains in chapters 13-14 of the Life, Plotinus had commentaries read to him, which he took up and developed, then the auditors asked questions. These questions are often objections that cannot be integrated as such within the development of the argument. This is why it is dangerous not to take the dialogue form into account, and even to speak of an imaginary objector (Plotinus, p. 310); moreover, the text itself contains signs indicating the shift from one interlocutor to another. Plotinus is no professor lecturing in a modern university classroom; his treatises are not systematic writings, but dialogues with more or less friendly auditors who defend viewpoints that could be very different, for instance the Gnostics (Life of Plotinus, chapter 16) and even Porphyry (Life of Plotinus, chapter 4).

What is more, Emilsson ignores Plotinus' links to the emperors Gordianus and especially Gallienus, with the senators who came to listen to him, and even his project for founding a Platonopolis (Life of Plotinus, chapter 12). Unlike Plato, who wished to transform his city as a function of his political ideas, Plotinus knew that his room for maneuver was extremely limited. The result was a considerable gap between theory and practice. This is why, despite what may have been said, one finds almost no theoretical considerations on politics in Plotinus, who discouraged the members of the Senate from pursuing their careers. It is also very hard to understand Plotinus' attitude to traditional religion, astrology and divination in Treatise 3 (III, 1) On Destiny, Treatise 15 (III,4) On Our Allotted Guardian Spirit, and Treatises 47 et 48 (II, 2 and 3 On Providence), without referring to chapters 10, 22 and 23 of the Life of Plotinus.

Finally, the section on Theodicy and Freedom is quite brief, and fails to take into account Plotinus' attitude to traditional religions, astrology, and above all the intense polemics against the Gnostics (Treatise 31 (V, 8) On the Intelligible Beauty; Treatise 33 (II, 9) Against the Gnostics). An entire section of Plotinus' thought must be situated in relation to his material and intellectual environment.

The Intellect, which emanates from the One, contains the Forms (eide) that are present in the Soul in the mode of "reasons), the Forms, and consequently the logoi, exist, live, and think. This explains in what sense Plotinus, like the Stoics, is a global vitalist. Everything in nature is alive: human beings, animals, plants, and even minerals. This generalized presence of the soul in the world explains "universal sympathy" and providence. In this perspective, one cannot accept Emilsson's affirmation that:

In addition to the original paradigmatic Ideas or Forms in Intellect, there are forms in souls and even forms in matter (enmattered forms). The latter are the sensible features of bodies, such as colors and shapes, whereas the forms in souls are concepts or rational formulas. These forms are descendants of the original Forms and may even be said to be the ideas at a lower stage of ontological derivation. (pp. 382-383)

All these distinctions are superfluous. It is always the same forms that can be found in different modes at every level; the goal is to show that everything in the sensible world, except matter, is permeated by the intelligible. It must be admitted that the logoi or forms that are present in matter (enule eide) have being, life and thought, and it is these same forms that sensation extracts from matter to turn them into representations that will be referred to the Forms in the Intellect, from which the logoi derive. Finally, one cannot maintain that "the sensible object as such is just a conglomeration of qualities in matter. There is nothing substantial about the conglomerate as such, which has no independent existence." (Plotinus, p. 224). Such an affirmation may be true in the context of an interpretation of Aristotelian categories, but not in Plotinus, as we can observe by re-reading Treatise 42, On the Kinds of Being (Enn. VI 1), where, as I tried to show (Plotin, Traités 27-29, 2005) the categories cannot be reduced to their linguistic and logical dimension, but must be understood in relation to the logoi. Finally, and above all, in the vast majority of its occurrences, the term ousia refers to true reality, or the Forms. In this perspective, sensible things, which are, in their own way, living beings, cannot be assimilated to an inert conglomerate of qualities (several treatises deal with these questions, but once can find a critical synthesis in Treatises 27-28 (Enn. IV 3 and 4 On Difficulties about the Soul).

Let us return to the soul's wanderings. The human soul descends from the region of the intelligible, where part of it remains, into the sensible, first providing itself with a "pneumatic vehicle", before entering an embryo that will become a human being. In addition, Plotinus accepts the doctrine of retribution, which implies metensomatosis, as we can see from a passage from Treatise 53, Ennead I, 1, 11, 5-16. The translation of this passage that is cited (Plotinus, p. 283) does not take the dialogue form into account. Above all, the formula "as is said" does not imply a restriction, but refers to Plato (Phaedrus 249b and Timaeus 42b-d), as is noted by J.F. Pradeau in a note to his translation of Treatise 53. It is the doctrine of metensomatosis that explains why Plotinus was a vegetarian, why he recommended to the members of his circle that they also practice vegetarianism, and why he even refused medicines based on animal substances (Life of Plotinus 2 and 7). This subject should not be passed over.

Treatise 19, On Virtues (Enn. I 2) is followed by Treatise 20, On Dialectic (Enn. I 3), as was quite natural for a Platonist. Plotinus does not oppose the various ethical doctrines in vogue at his time to one another, but establishes a hierarchy among them, by redefining the cardinal virtues of Plato's Republic: moderation, courage, wisdom, and justice, at each level. In this perspective, the contemplative virtues, which have dialectic as their instrument, are placed at the very top of the list, for they enable assimilation to the divine through knowledge. However, this dominant position does not make the sage a hermit, or a philosophy professor who never leaves his classroom or his office. The sage has bodily needs (food, sexuality, etc.), and may suffer from physical or psychic ailments. This is why he must also practice the purificatory virtues, which consist in detaching oneself from the affections coming from the body and thus allow him to practice the contemplation of the intelligible. Moreover, he must not neglect the civic virtues, which promote moderation, and make for a peaceful life in common. This is why it is odd, to say the least, to devote an entire section (pp. 325-330) to the ethics of everyday life, and to write:

Discussing Plotinus' ethics through the lenses of contemporary ethical theory or ethical beliefs can easily lead one astray and block understanding. It is commonly assumed that ethics is essentially about preserving and promoting the good of others and hence about holding partiality and egoism in check. Though incorporating other regarding norms in various ways, ancient ethics does not generally make these assumptions about the nature of ethics. It is even more important to note this in Plotinus' case than in most others. Yet, it is perfectly fair to ask if we find the Plotinian sage palatable. Is he, for instance, an egoist? (pp. 325-326)

The sage described in Treatise 46 On Happiness (Enn. I 4) is a human being who must face the necessities of life and who lives and moves within society. In the Life of Plotinus, we see a Plotinus who concerns himself with the orphans he has taken in, and who serves as an arbiter in disputes between the citizens: it is hard to turn him into an egoist who lacks compassions.

Finally, the first section of chapter 10, on Mystical Experience, remains problematic. In Plotinus and in Porphyry, the term "mystical" itself designates a kind of interpretation of myths (which Plotinus practiced, as has been admirably shown by Pierre Hadot (on Narcissus, 1976; on Ouranus, Kronos and Zeus 1981) and by J. Pépin (on Herakles, 1969; on Dionysus 1972), a practice which is not discussed in this book), and it does not correspond at all to the two definitions of "mysticism" given in the Oxford dictionary, which have meaning only in a Christian context. For Plotinus, the soul's unification with the One is a modified state of consciousness brought about by intense intellectual concentration. This kind of modified state of consciousness has nothing to do with religion, for it can be triggered by fear, pleasure, and even alcohol and drugs (Michel Hulin, La mystique sauvage, 2008). The soul that practices the virtues, and especially the contemplative virtues, is momentarily identified with the Intellect which, for its part, becomes identified with the One. Here we see a perfect coherence between Treatises 19 (Enn. I, 2), On Virtues, 20 (Enn. I, 3) On Dialectic and 38 How the Multitude of the Forms Came into Being and On the Good (Enn. VI 7). In short, for Plotinus, who remains a man of flesh and blood immersed within Roman society, philosophy is not a university discipline: it is a way of life, as Pierre Hadot (2002) reminded us. This reminder suffices to challenge the validity of an approach focused on conceptual speculation.

As far as posterity is concerned, there should have been some discussion of the criticism by Iamblichus and later Neoplatonists of the doctrine that a part of the soul remains in the Intelligible. The rejection of this doctrinal point led to the development of the levels of virtues, whose history is described by Marinus in his Life of Proclus.

As I said at the outset, this book is impeccable from a material, pedagogical, and academic viewpoint. However, it describes a Plotinus with the features of a contemporary philosophy professor living and working in a high-level university. He is an intellectual, interested essentially in epistemology and ethics, in their anthropological, cognitive, and logical dimensions. This book provides an image of Plotinus that corresponds to the standard modern interpretation, in line with neo-Kantianism, a trend that has these two characteristics: it gives priority to a subject that constitutes its object, whereas in Antiquity, it was the object that had priority; and it promulgates universal formal moral rules that are very different from those that sanctioned behavior in ancient societies, which were marked by particularism. Such an approach is not questionable in itself, but it is reductionist. It must be repeated: for Plotinus, philosophy is a way of life. What is more, Platonic thought in general cannot be reduced to a theoretical superstructure without relation to what is real, for it was in order to account for the human being's ability to act in the sensible world, to think about it, and to talk about it that Plato and his followers were led to speak of the Soul, the Intellect, and even of the One.

This is an important book that brings to the surface the merits and the weaknesses of an interpretation that is tending to become standard in a context in which philosophy is no longer a way of life, but a university discipline.


Armstrong, A. H. (1940), The Architecture of the Intelligible in the Philosophy of Plotinus, Cambridge University Press.

Bréhier, E. (1924-1988), Plotin, Ennéades, Les Belles Lettres, 7 vol.

Brisson, L. and Pradeau, J.F. (eds). (2002-2010), Plotin, Traités, Flammarion, 9 vol.

Brisson, L. (2005), Plotin, Traités 27-29, Flammarion.

Brisson, L. (2017), "Can one speak of mysticism in Plotinus?", in John F. Finamore and Sarah Klitenic Wear (eds.), Defining Platonism. Essays in Honor of the 75th Birthday of John M. Dillon, Franciscan University Press, pp.96-116.

Chiaradonna, R. (2009), Plotino, Carocci.

Emilson, E. K. (1988), Plotinus on Sense-Perception: A Philosophical Study, Cambridge University Press.

Emilson, E. K. (2007), Plotinus on Intellect, Clarendon Press.

Emilson, E. K. (2015), Plotinus, Ennead VI.4 and VI.5. On the presence of being, One and the Same, Everywhere as a Whole, Eyjólfur K. Emilsson and Steven K. Strange (trs.), Parmenides Publishing.

Hadot, P. (1960, 1999), "Être, Vie, Pensée chez Plotin et avant Plotin", in Les sources de Plotin, Entretiens sur l'Antiquité classique, Vandoeuvres-Genève: Fondation Hardt, pp.105-157; reprint dans Plotin, Porphyre. Études néoplatoniciennes, Vrin, pp.127-181.

Hadot, P. (1963, 1993), Plotin ou la simplicité du regard, Paris, Plon; Plotinus or The Simplicity of Vision, Michael Chase (tr.), University of Chicago Press.

Hadot, P. (1981), "Ouranos, Kronos and Zeus in Plotinus' treatment Against the Gnostics", in H. J. Blumenthal and R. A. Markus (eds.), Neoplatonism and Early Christian Thought. Variorum.

Hadot, P. (1995, 2002), Qu'est-ce que la philosophie antique? Pierre Hadot, Paris: Gallimard; What Is Ancient Philosophy, Michael Chase (tr.), Harvard University Press.

Hulin, M. (1993), Mystique sauvage: aux antipodes de l'esprit. Presses Universitaires de France.

Igal, J. (1982-1998), Plotino, Enéadas, Gredos.

O'Meara, D. J. (1992, 1993), Plotin: une introduction aux Ennéades, Cerf; Plotinus. An Introduction to the Enneads, Oxford University Press.

Pépin, J. (1955), "Plotin et les mythes", Revue Internationale de Philosophie, 53, pp. 5-27.

Pépin, J. (1970), "Plotin et le miroir de Dionysos (Enn. IV, 3 [27], 12, 2)", Revue Internationale de Philosophie 24, 1970, pp. 304-320.

Pépin, J. (1971), "Héraclès et son reflet dans le néoplatonisme", in Le néoplatonisme, éd. du CNRS.

Rist, J. M. (1967), Plotinus: The Road to Reality, Cambridge University Press.