Plural Logic

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Alex Oliver and Timothy Smiley, Plural Logic, Oxford University Press, 2013, 336pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199570423.

Reviewed by David A. Nicolas, Institut Jean Nicod


Many natural languages, like English and French, make a grammatical distinction between singular and plural. At first sight, some sentences containing plural terms seem to be equivalent to a conjunction of sentences containing singular expressions:

Peter and Bill are young.

Peter is young and Bill is young.

These sentences contain 'distributive' predicates, predicates that distribute over their arguments, applying to each individually. However, other sentences don't have similar equivalents:

Peter and Bill met doesn't mean Peter met and Bill met.

They contain 'collective' predicates, which apply to their arguments collectively, not individually. So how should the meaning of sentences containing plurals be characterized in general?

Many philosophers and natural language semanticists adopt a 'singularist' approach: what a plural term denotes is an individual -- a collection, group, set, or sum. Thus, Peter and Bill met would mean that the collection/group/set/sum of Peter and Bill met. The plural is thereby analyzed in terms of the singular, plus an appropriate notion of collection.

By contrast, some philosophers and logicians adopt a 'pluralist' approach. They claim that the plural cannot be satisfactorily analyzed in terms of the singular. So plural reference, plural quantification, and plural predication must be recognized as primitive. They can then form part of genuinely plural logics.

The debate between singularism and pluralism is important for the following reasons. First, semanticists would like to have the most adequate semantics for plurals. Second, plural logic has become a popular tool in the philosophy of mathematics and metaphysics because: (i) (A particular system of) Plural logic has the expressive and deductive power of monadic second-order logic; (ii) Unlike second-order logic, plural logic seems ontologically innocent. (Second-order quantifiers range over a different type of entities than first-order quantifiers. But plural quantifiers seem to range over the exact same things as singular quantifiers. So their use wouldn't commit one to anything new.)

Alex Oliver and Timothy Smiley have published several influential papers on this debate and on plural logic. They integrate and slightly update them in this book. In their clear and combative style, they introduce the relevant notions and offer rebuttals to arguments that would oppose their own positions.

After an introductory chapter and some history, they discuss various singularist strategies for analyzing plurals away in chapters 3 and 4. They find serious problems with all of them and conclude that singularism is untenable. I will discuss their main argument against singularism in the second part of my review.

In chapters 5 to 10, they examine several linguistic phenomena pertaining to plurals. First, they characterize various kinds of terms as empty, singular, and plural. Among the plural terms, they distinguish plural proper names, definite descriptions, functional terms, and free relatives. Looking at plural denotation, they argue, interestingly, that it can be conceived in two ways that are equally satisfactory: it can either be seen as a distributive relation between a term and what it denotes, or as a collective relation. Then, they introduce two basic notions of plural logic, plural quantification (e.g., some things) and the 'inclusion relation' (is/are or is/are among), and they illustrate the variety of collective predicates. Focusing on plural descriptions, they distinguish three uses of them ('exhaustive', 'plurally unique', and 'plurally exhaustive'). Unfortunately, they don't establish that plural descriptions are ambiguous between these uses. The 'exhaustive' is a particular case of the 'plurally unique', which is itself a particular case of the 'plurally exhaustive'. So it would be simpler to admit only the latter: a plural description of the form the Fs denotes all the joint satisfiers of the predicate Fs. For instance, the twin primes denotes all pairs of twin primes.

Turning to lists of terms, such as Whitehead and Russell, they suggest, again, that two equally satisfactory accounts can be adopted. On the first, lists are genuine plural terms. On the second, they are mere strings of separate items, which feed different arguments to a given predicate. Thus, Whitehead and Russell met for a beer is represented as: met-for-a-beer(w,r), with the predicate taking two arguments (w for Whitehead, r for Russell). However, this immediately leads to a problem not discussed. Any case in which the order of the terms of a list doesn't matter requires adopting a meaning postulate to the effect that the predicate applies to all permutations of its argument positions. If we just focus on Whitehead and Russell, one postulate is enough: met-for-a-beer(w,r) met-for-a-beer(r,w). But as soon as we consider more arguments, the number of postulates explodes: with n arguments, n! meaning postulates are required to cover all permutations.

Then in chapters 11, 12 and 13, Oliver and Smiley develop three different logics in detail. First, a 'singular' logic. This logic has only singular terms, singular quantifiers (e.g., there exists something that . . . ) and singular predicates (predicates applying to singular terms). But by contrast with first-order predicate logic, this logic aims to be 'topic neutral'. In particular, a term may apply to something or to nothing (as does the present king of France). Moreover, the domain of discourse is not restricted to be a set. Instead, it is taken to be some things, which can be all the things that there are. Then, they develop 'mid-plural' logic, which contains plural variables, a predicate expressing inclusion, and an operator symbolizing 'exhaustive' plural description. And finally, they present 'full plural' logic, where plural variables may be bound by quantifiers, and which contains an operator symbolizing 'plurally unique' description.

Lastly, they motivate and develop a version of Cantorian set theory formalized using full plural logic. Interestingly, this set theory does without an empty set and without singletons.

In the rest of this review, I concentrate on the case against singularism, made mostly in chapter 3. As said, singularism is the family of views according to which the plural should be analyzed in terms of the singular, plus an appropriate notion of collection. The objections Oliver and Smiley raise against singularism make a good case for the need of a genuine plural logic. But contrary to Oliver and Smiley's presentation, few of their objections seem to me to be foolproof.

In section 5 and in the appendix of chapter 3, following similar arguments found in Boolos (1984) and Schein (1993), Oliver and Smiley present a general, knockdown argument against singularism. They claim that any sufficiently general singularist semantics runs into an analog of Russell's paradox. For simplicity of exposition, let us suppose here that the notion of collection used is the notion of set. In mathematics, one may want to talk about absolutely all sets:

 Any set satisfies the axioms of set theory.

There are some sets such that any set is one of them just in case it is not a member of itself.

What semantics can a singularist advocate for the second, 'Russellian' sentence? Using sets as collections and interpreting is one of by set-membership, one may propose:

∃y x (x y x x)

But if the quantifiers ∃y and x range over the same sets and if y exists, we get a contradiction:

y y y y

So if the sentence ranges over all sets, and if it is translated as proposed, then the sentence must be false (y cannot exist), while it seems to be genuinely true.

One possible response is that the translation proposed is adequate. But the range of the quantifier translating the plural there are some sets (∃y) is bigger than the range of the quantifier translating the singular any set (x). Russell's paradox shows that, contrary to appearances, one cannot really quantify over all sets. The concept of set is indefinitely extensible: whenever we have formed a conception of a certain range of sets, we can define a set that isn't in that range (Glanzberg 2004).

Another possible response is that like most arguments against singularism, the Russellian argument presupposes that one can talk about collections in the object language. This can be denied. We can see why by considering a different problem. For various linguists, the appropriate notion of collection is that of mereological sum. Oliver and Smiley argue that sums are inappropriate since there are more sums of individuals than individuals themselves (in the finite case, if there are n individuals, then there are 2n - 1 sums). Given how mereological sums are defined, the expressions the sums of individuals and the individuals should denote the same sum, so such a singularist semantics predicts that the sentence There are more sums of individuals than individuals is false. However, this problem arises only because one is using specialized vocabulary from the metalanguage (individual, sum) in the object language. A possible lesson is that one shouldn't do so. When doing the semantics of the metalanguage, a different, meta-metalanguage must be used, with new notions of 'sum' and 'sum formation'. And so ad infinitum. This gives rise to a hierarchy of metalanguages. But the friend of plural logic who wants to quantify over everything is in a similar position. Rayo (2006) shows that if absolute quantification is possible in a given object language, the metalanguage used to capture its semantics must be strictly stronger. And so ad infinitum. So the friend of plural logic who accepts that one can quantify over everything is also led to postulating an infinite hierarchy of metalanguages.

Overall, Oliver and Smiley's book is full of careful and precise developments, as well as witty arguments. It recapitulates in one place all their previous works. It thereby provides a good survey of plural logic and the most important issues connected to it. It complements well several other nice entry points to the field, such as McKay (2006), Linnebo (2008) and Yi (2005), to name just a few.


Boolos, G. (1984). To be is to be a value of a variable (or to be some values of some variables). The Journal of Philosophy 81, 430-449.

Glanzberg, M. (2004). Quantification and realism. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 69, 541-572.

Linnebo, Ø. (2008). Plural quantification. In E. N. Zalta (ed.), The Stanford Encyclopedia of Philosophy (Winter 2008 Edition).

McKay, T. (2006). Plural predication. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Rayo, A. (2006). Beyond plurals. In A. Rayo, & G. Uzquiano (eds.), Absolute generality (pp. 220-254). Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Schein, B. (1993). Plurals and events. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Yi, B.-U. (2005). The logic and meaning of plurals. Part I. Journal of Philosophical Logic 34, 459-506.


This work was supported by the grants ANR-10-LABX-0087 IEC and ANR-10-IDEX-0001-02 PSL*.