Plutarch's ""Maxime cum principibus philosopho esse disserendum": An Interpretation with Commentary""

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Geert Roskam, Plutarch's ""Maxime cum principibus philosopho esse disserendum": An Interpretation with Commentary"", Leuven UP, 2009, 252 pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789058677365.

Reviewed by Myrto Hatzimichali, University College London



What is the philosopher’s role in society and what should his relationship be with those in power? Roskam studies Plutarch’s response to this famous problem in his book, which consists of a detailed in-depth analysis of the short work On the fact that the philosopher must primarily consort with rulers (Roskam uses the Latin title, with Maxime cum principibus for short). The general direction of Plutarch’s thesis is clear from this title, and Roskam further highlights the ‘radical conviction’ (p. 89) advocated in the work, namely that the philosopher ought not merely to choose the practical/political life over the theoretical one, but also actively to seek the ear of the ruler ahead of other potential pupils or interlocutors. The main virtue of Roskam’s book lies in the clarity and scholarly thoroughness of the exposition, which follows Plutarch’s argument closely, elucidating it through detailed discussion and documentation with ample comparative material, mainly from Plutarch’s other works, but also from the broader Greek philosophical tradition, with which Plutarch was fully conversant and critically engaged.

The present book on Maxime cum principibus will be of particular interest to classical scholars working on Plutarch, as Roskam situates the treatise firmly in the context of the Greek polymath’s large output. This volume is not designed to cater to readers without Greek and Latin, as passages and short phrases in the classical languages are not translated, and works by Plutarch are cited by their traditional Latin titles. Readers with broader interests in political philosophy will be reflecting on the value and validity of Plutarch’s position on the relationship between philosophy and power, so perhaps more could have been done to assess and demonstrate the importance of Maxime cum principibus for such debates. Roskam’s own discussion stays focused on the work at hand and examines the philosophy/power relationship primarily in the light of Plutarch’s personality and of the more benign political conditions that prevailed in the Roman Empire after Trajan’s rise to power (in AD 98).

The Maxime cum principibus itself is more an ethical protreptic advocating a particular conduct on the part of the philosopher, rather than a piece of mainstream political philosophy. As Roskam points out (p. 69), the work concerns the philosopher’s, not the ruler’s behaviour, and moreover (p.135) nowhere in this short text does Plutarch touch upon questions about the nature of government or absolute rule. A sole ruler seems to be assumed throughout without question, a ruler whose power may be turned to good cause under the philosopher’s influence.

Roskam begins his survey with some remarks on Plutarch’s political and philosophical biography and pedigree, followed by a treatment of the date and the contested nature of the Plutarchan work in question (Ch. 1). The latter has been sometimes seen as a theoretical treatise or essay, while Roskam emphasises the element of practical public engagement on Plutarch’s part by interpreting the text as a didactic philosophical discourse (dialexis). He then considers two further interpretative ‘stepping stones’ (Ch. 2), the first of which is a historical survey of earlier philosophers’ stances towards politics and political power, as seen through Plutarch’s eyes. Much of the material assembled here reminds us that Plutarch was also one of the most prominent biographers from Antiquity, as there is a strong emphasis on philosophers’ political actions rather than their theories (see p. 57).

Roskam’s historical review serves to connect Plutarch’s argument in Maxime cum principibus with the Academic-Peripatetic tradition as Plutarch saw it. In the section on Plato (Ch. 2.1.4) a central question is whether the ‘dilemma’ of the Republic (5.473c-d: “unless … either philosophers become kings in our states or those whom we now call our kings and rulers take to the pursuit of philosophy seriously and adequately”) can yield any other political role for the philosopher apart from that of philosopher-king. Roskam argues that in Maxime cum principibus Plutarch advocates the ‘more moderate’ combination of political power and philosophical insight in the form of the philosopher-counsellor, who does not rule himself, but has an impact on the ruler. Elsewhere, Roskam notes, Plutarch promoted the ‘more rigid’ application of Plato’s ideal in the form of the philosopher-ruler (Life of Numa; To an uneducated ruler). In the discussion of consistency as the second interpretative ‘stepping stone’, Plutarch’s take on the Academic-Peripatetic tradition is shown to be but one aspect of his theoretical commitments, alongside his ‘concern for the philosopher’s consistency between words and deeds’. Far fewer pages (compared to the length of the earlier historical survey) are devoted to this second aspect, which is grounded on Plutarch’s ethical views.

The detailed analysis of Plutarch’s argument in Maxime cum principibus (Ch. 3) constitutes the backbone of Roskam’s book. He takes the reader through a chapter-by-chapter explanation of Plutarch’s defence of the thesis that the philosopher should consort with rulers, highlighting the underlying structure behind the apparent lack of overall cohesion, the repetitions and the abrupt conclusion. The complex structure of Plutarch’s work is also schematised in a flowchart (p. 139) and a systematic outline of its content (pp. 140-44).

Plutarch begins and ends the first chapter in a defensive mode, arguing against those (not necessarily a particular philosophical school) who accuse the politically-minded philosopher of being self-promoting and ambitious. He points out that if philosophical education is to be ‘for everyone’ this will naturally include powerful men and rulers. These arguments, which make the weaker point that the philosopher should not avoid the company of rulers, enclose in a circular structure (see p. 96) the stronger point that it is part of his duties as philosopher to seek actively and primarily the company of those in power. This is supported by an argument based on the maximisation of one’s usefulness for society (the philosopher benefits many through his influence on one). Roskam explains how the potential utilitarian overtones of this view are mitigated by Plutarch’s appeals to the ideals of philokalia (love of what is honourable) and philanthropia (genuine humanitarian regard for one’s fellow citizens), ideals that resonate throughout Plutarch’s works.

The second chapter of Maxime cum principibus begins with the contrast between ‘thought/discourse residing in the mind’ (logos endiathetos) and ‘thought/discourse uttered towards another’ (logos prophorikos), a distinction that Plutarch treats as obvious and trivial, and which is ascribed to the Stoics in Sextus Empiricus and Porphyry (pp. 96-7, with notes). Both of these types of logos, Plutarch claims, lead to friendship, either towards oneself or towards another. It is not immediately obvious how this distinction relates to the question of the philosopher’s engagement with rulers, and Roskam does well to show that the reference to friendship is put forward in order to oppose it to other less acceptable motives for public engagement, namely money and fame. This also provides a link with Plutarch’s earlier remarks against the critics of the politically-minded philosopher. The chapter contains a further distinction (subtly connected to what precedes through the idea of fame), this time between the ‘uninvolved/apolitical’ (apragmon) and the ‘political’ philosopher. The main difference here is that the former merely does not avoid powerful and distinguished interlocutors, whereas the latter actively embraces them. Roskam rightly points out that Plutarch’s acceptance of the apragmon philosopher’s stance as a viable alternative undermines his main thesis, according to which the philosopher is required to converse with rulers (p. 116).

The third chapter returns to the central argument in favour of Plutarch’s main thesis, namely the maximisation of usefulness. The additional point made here is that benefitting many, which in the philosopher’s case is achieved through influence on the ruler, is more pleasant for the benefactor than benefitting only a few people. The chapter contains an interesting example of Plutarch’s use of his opponents’ philosophical views: in this case, Epicurus’ support is enlisted for the claim that conferring benefit is not only more honourable but also more pleasant than receiving it. However, as Roskam shows, this is a modification of Epicurus’ view, which is adjusted to Plutarch’s own values through inclusion of the ‘honourable’ (to kalon), a concept that does not actually feature in Epicurus (p. 121). Plutarch’s position on pleasure is a topic that could have elicited some more comment from Roskam, especially in connection with Roskam’s remark that the philosopher by benefiting others ‘derives his personal pleasure and as such remains the source of his own happiness’ (p. 138, emphasis added). Such a strong causal connection between pleasure and happiness is not self-evident for an anti-Epicurean, therefore the extent to which it is endorsed by Plutarch merits further exploration in this context.

Plutarch’s final chapter lists anecdotal examples of people who took pleasure in promoting the common good, and leaps from the pleasure of the craftsman who made the wooden tablets on which Solon’s laws were inscribed, to the claim that philosophical instruction may resemble law if safely endorsed by the ruler. The final remarks of the work seek to account for Plato’s failure to realise this claim with Dionysius of Syracuse, by blaming Dionysius’ prior corruption. Roskam sees here a positive confirmation/test case for everything Plutarch has been arguing up to this point, but it is hard to see how this negative example that focuses on one ruler’s substantial limitations can embody the protreptic urging philosophers to try to influence those in power. Perhaps we should take these remarks more as a Platonist’s defensive response to a potential counter-example that crucially involves Plato himself. There is also an admission that, for reasons beyond his control, the philosopher may not always be successful in maximising his usefulness to the community, followed by one last piece of protreptic advice, namely that the ruler should be approached at a young age.

The final section of Roskam’s book is a Commentary, which includes a summary of the content at the beginning of each chapter, and uses lemmas from the Greek text. The comments cover various points of interest, illustrated by many parallels across the Plutarchan corpus. There are a surprising number of textual problems for such a short work, all thoroughly examined with juxtaposition of different scholars’ solutions. The Commentary also deals with matters of linguistic usage, prosopography and mythology, relevant historical events and literary texts, as well as details of philosophical doctrine that are not directly related to the main argument (e.g. a theory of action with reference to impulses, judgements and decisions, p. 155). No full text or translation of the work is provided; yet this is essential in order to follow Roskam’s argument properly, which means that the reader has to seek additional resources. A full text would have taken up only a few pages as we are dealing with a very short treatise, but perhaps there were other constraints that dictated the final decision.

On the whole, Roskam’s work represents a significant contribution to the understanding of Plutarch’s thought. Its systematic engagement with detail through the close reading of Maxime cum principibus makes it a valuable tool for specialists, but it is less suitable for newcomers to Plutarch, especially if they do not read Greek and Latin in the original.