Political Affect: Connecting the Social and the Somatic

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John Protevi, Political Affect: Connecting the Social and the Somatic, U. of Minnesota Press, 2009, 241pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780816665105.

Reviewed by Dorothea Olkowski, University of Colorado



In Political Affect: Connecting the Social and the Somatic, John Protevi purports to bring together politically activist philosophy with cognitive science to obtain a nonmechanistic materialism, which he then applies to three contemporary social crises. According to his thesis, individualistic subjectivity is bypassed insofar as the social and somatic (including emotion) are directly linked to one another in the production of social states of affairs that result in the crimes attributed to individuals, thereby bypassing individual responsibility. At least one of the author’s case studies supports this account, but it is questionable that the other two do. Nor do they present the reader with solid ethical alternatives other than the destratification of the body such that neither emotion nor reason are qualities of a person, but only moments affecting a body.

The philosophy that Protevi uses to carry out this study is primarily that of Gilles Deleuze, and the cognitive science comes from a variety of sources in the field of embodied or affective cognition. Their coming together initially takes shape around the concepts of emergence and complexity. Protevi’s account of these two concepts borrows from the work of biologist Jack Cohen and mathematician Ian Stewart who, in their book, The Collapse of Chaos, write that “rigid, predetermined, simple laws can lead to behavior so irregular that it is to all intents and purposes random” (p. 20).1 In other words, simple rules or laws can generate complex effects called chaos. The authors go on to argue that emergent simplicities collapse chaos, meaning they bring order to systems that appear random. This is not apparent in the case of single atoms; however, in the case of statistical averaging, it is normal procedure. Statistically average properties emerge from the micro level of atomic scales when mathematicians smooth out micro scale fluctuations through idealization and approximation. What is important about the emergence of such simplicities is that they are predictable, and as such lead to recognizable and exploitable features that may serve as building blocks for higher level structures (p. 233).

Significantly, the difference between chaos and simplicity is smaller than Protevi makes it out to be. Both are characteristics of non-linear dynamical systems. Chaotic systems are unpredictable, thus complex. Science lacks a causal theory to explain complexity; therefore it relies on phenomenological (descriptive) theories. Following de Landa, Protevi argues that Deleuze is on the side of simplicity. This, however, is simply not the case. Deleuze’s philosophy is explicitly a version of deterministic chaos. Mathematical dynamic systems, such as Deleuze’s, are oriented by deterministic chaos, which defines systems whose initial conditions and whose mathematical rules of operation are known but which nevertheless do not have deterministically predictable trajectories due to uncertainties arising from initial conditions and boundary conditions. Currently, these tend to be theoretical and computer- based systems belonging to a branch of “experimental mathematics,” so that at present, “chaos is extremely difficult to identify in real world data.”2

Explicitly turning away from open-system thermodynamics (in What is Philosophy?), Deleuze conceptualizes an immanent but still closed, deterministic, atomistic and reversible system that is not immediately reduced to entropic equilibrium because its processes take place on the molecular level, at speeds that he hypothesizes are beyond the speed of light. It is a system governed by sensitivity to initial starting points and unstable boundaries; thus under certain conditions it is chaotic, but fundamentally it is probabalistic, a deterministic system formalized by means of differential calculus and vector fields that allow us to make determinations beyond a single trajectory.3 Deleuze seeks “a complete determination with regard to the existence and distribution of … [regular and singular] points” which depends on an instance characterized in terms of a field of vectors.4 Singular points are, literally, points at which a surface breaks down, making possible new directions for the vectors that fill it. Mathematically, they are points at which a given function of a complex variable has no derivative but of which every neighborhood contains points at which the function has derivatives. It is an awkward and disruptive mechanism, akin to reorganizing consciousness by prescribing schizophrenia. The widespread presence of singularities in Deleuze’s formulation of nature would seem to disrupt simplicity where the latter is understood to be the emergence of recognizable and exploitable features, building blocks or regularities.

Moreover, Deleuze is seeking explicitly to link differential equations and vector fields. A vector field is defined by Deleuze, in Difference and Repetition, as the complete determination of a problem given in terms of the existence, number and distribution of points that are its condition.5 This definition corresponds fairly well to the mathematical definition of a vector field as associating a vector to every point in the field space. What is unique for Deleuze, and what makes this an ontological claim, is that he calls this vector field nature and argues that nature is governed by the same axioms that govern mathematical vector fields. Given this physical account, Deleuze argues that perceptions and affections are not those of “man.” They belong to the things being studied; thus they are percepts and affects of physical forces. Humans feel their effects but only insofar as they become ideal observers, (i.e., meaning) molecular, thus devoid of all subjectivity, existing as an effect of nature’s affects and percepts, with the ability to distinguish between rapid and slow molecules and those with high or weak energy.6

Strangely, when Protevi describes the Columbine, Colorado High School shootings as " a killing machine consisting of Klebold-Harris-bombs-guns-school," he does so not with the tools of emergent simplicity, but with those of deterministic chaos (p. 158). What led the killers to this act and then to suicide, he argues, was nothing more than what I have called a singularity, literally, burn out due to the physiological intensity of their actions. Following Deleuze, they are effects of molecular, physical forces. They are not responsible agents but victims of physical and physiological forces that overtook them. This leads to the question of why we care to understand this act. Unless we are part of their machine, why would we pay attention to it? Is there possibly something else at work that accounts for our distress over this incident? This direction of argumentation, that of abstract machines, begins to unravel in Protevi’s analysis of the government response to Hurricane Katrina.

He begins with an account of the state of the Mississippi River delta and the river itself after the U.S. Army Corps of Engineers’ construction of levees and channels, the production of sugar cane using slave labor, the global heat-exchange that generates hurricanes, the Louisiana slave revolt, and the anxiety of neo-liberal economics. This takes us to looters and predators obeying the laws of nature (every man relying on his own strength and art), and finally to a strange conclusion:

The stories we tell … do not always have to focus on the every man for himself fantasy of the Hobbes-mongers … but they should also be the stories of the thousands and thousands and thousands of brave and loving people of New Orleans who refused to leave their old, their sick, their young, their helpless (p. 181).

The question is, how can he give a “rigorous differential materialist reading,” of the ability to tell the stories of others, let alone the stories of the love of others? Somehow infantile face recognition and inscribed brain patterns do not seem to provide a thorough account of what happened. Statistically, we can say that most people did not harm others. Most people helped one another. Mathematically, we can provide equations that describe the movements of those people as they faced or fled the disaster. But none of this tells us how it is possible for us to tell their stories. None of this tells us about how our own sensibilities can be open to the sensibilities of others when they decide to commit horrible acts or acts of love. Perhaps this is still what we need to know.

1 Cohen, Jack and Ian Stewart, The Collapse of Chaos: Discovering Simplicity in a Complex World (New York: Viking Books, 1994).

2 Schneider, Eric D. and Dorion Sagan, Into the Cool: Energy Flow, Thermodynamics and Life (Chicago: U. of Chicago Press, 2005), p. 30: “Edward Lorenz accidentally discovered the field of D chaos while using a computer to model atmospheric trajectories … the end points of the trajectories were unpredictable because they were highly dependent on initial conditions and the exact boundary conditions, which could not be determined with enough precision”.

3 Deleuze, Gilles. Difference and Repetition, tr. Paul Patton (New York: Columbia UP, 1994), p. 177. Originally published in French as Différence et Répétition (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1968).

4 Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, p. 177.

5 Deleuze, Difference and Repetition, p. 177.

6 Deleuze, Gilles and Félix Guattari, What is Philosophy? tr. Hugh Tomlinson and Graham Burchell (New York: Columbia UP, 1994), p. 130. Originally published in French as Qu’est-ce que la philosophie? (Paris: Les Editions de Minuit, 1991).