Political Categories: Thinking Beyond Concepts

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Michael Marder, Political Categories: Thinking Beyond Concepts, Columbia University Press, 2019, 255pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780231188692.

Reviewed by Nathan J. Jun, Midwestern State University


In the opening salvo of this intriguing volume, Michael Marder takes aim at the "concept or the idea, the one all-powerful notion tasked with laying bare, dissecting and explaining reality" -- a notion by which Western philosophy has long been, and continues to be, held captive (1). The principal manifestation of "this fixation on a single principle behind a plethora of beings and events" within modern political thinking has been ideology, which Marder characterizes as "an extensive and largely unnoticeable dominant framework for thinking and perceiving, which precludes those interpretations that do not accord with its parameters." Concepts in general and ideologies in particular, he suggests, aim at subsuming and ultimately subordinating "complex, plural, complicated, conflictual, and at times mutually contradictory explanations" by imposing a kind of "silent consensus" upon reality (2). Although this would seem to "simplify life and thought, spinning the fabric of existence without folds and saving us the energy (and the trouble) of thinking and acting in a nonautomatic, deliberate way," Marder thinks this comes at the expense of "the multiplicity of the thing itself" (1-2). Within the domain of political thinking in particular, our insistence on viewing complex "political realities" through the lens of monolithic ideas and principles has resulted in an abject failure to understand them (6). Marder's central thesis is that these realities are better understood through categories.

Although the idea of thinking in terms of categories will be familiar to students of philosophy -- particularly those who have studied a bit of Aristotle and Kant -- Marder is keen to avoid what he sees as a problematic and pervasive tendency within metaphysics to reduce categories to concepts. On his view, categories are "folds, complications, pleats in being that crisscross the artificial subject-object chasm" (2). Unlike concepts, he writes, "the categories respect the multiplicity of the thing itself, as they reflect its various dimensions . . . [and] no category alone can exhaust the sense of anything (of any thing), the machinations of metaphysics notwithstanding." For these reasons, categories are better understood "phenomenologically" -- an approach which obliges us "to invert the relation between categories and concepts" (3) such that concepts are seen as "born of a categorical reduction, that is, of selective blindness that lets the plurality of categories drop by the wayside" (3). This is especially true in the context of political thinking, wherein abstract universals "stand little chance against political polarization that effaces all nuanced positions not in conformity with dominant extremes" (7).

In the second and third chapters, Marder brings this perspective to bear on re-interpreting the categories in the writings of Aristotle and Kant. This is no easy feat, given Western philosophy's deeply entrenched tendency to reduce categories to some other category or concept. Although it is beyond the scope of this review to discuss these chapters at length, Marder's attempt to re-think Aristotle's and Kant's categories as distinct but intersecting folds is intriguing and made with an impressive degree of precision. This complicated and ambitious enterprise reaches its crescendo in the fourth and final chapter, where Marder considers the possible ramifications of his view of categorical thinking for political thought writ large. Here traditional political unit-ideas including the state, revolution, power, and sovereignty are recast as "junction[s] for . . . categories liberally drawn from Aristotle and Kant" (136). In practice, this is ultimately a matter of treating "positionality, relation, modality, quantity, and quality, among others" as the "point of departure" from which we attempt to understand various concrete political realities. The principal advantage of this approach, Marder writes, "is that it commits to a multifaceted view, which refrains from figuring or disfiguring the political entity and portrays it, as far as practicable in accord with its own demarcations, following its contours" (137).

By way of brief example: In contrast with conventional approaches to the state -- which, as Marder notes, "has invariably appeared as a figure for something or someone beyond the institution itself . . . clothed in layer upon layer of mythological meaning" or, more recently, as "an inflexible institutional architecture" (135) -- Marder's "phenomelogical" approach examines the state chiefly -- not exclusively -- through the category of positionality. A state is not a thing so much as a "position, a posture, a status" that provides a "response to an existential-phenomenological question: How does where one stands stand?" (136). Put another way, the state may be seen as "something essentially human" insofar as it designates the condition of a people who have a certain "legal, political, or ontological standing" in relation to other people (138), or as "stance" that people take toward each other, "both among those who comprise a polity standing side by side, shoulder to shoulder, and between states, each of them turned toward rivaling political units in a face-to-face alliance or confrontation, overt or covert" (141). The complex variations that exist among these positions or stances may be understood in turn by means of other categories and subcategories such as "community, causality-dependence, and substance-accident" (141).

Though it is unquestionably impressive in its creativity, depth of insight, and overall analytic force, Marder's book is also extremely complicated and resists any kind of overarching appraisal. I feel as though I am nowhere near understanding Marder's thesis to my own satisfaction, let alone appreciating its implications for my own work in political philosophy and the history of political thought. Assuming I have done passable justice to that thesis, however, I should like to offer a few thoughts by way of response. Marder's principal motivation, it seems to me is his dissatisfaction with political thinking based on overarching concepts and conceptual systems. Although I am sympathetic to his concerns on this score, he seems to overlook various alternative ways of thinking about concepts that are deliberately intended to address the same (or similar concerns), whether or not they ultimately succeed in doing so.

To cite one notable example: Michael Freeden's theory of ideology -- though it was explicitly developed in opposition to the notion that concepts are static monoliths with "a life of their own" -- attempts to re-think (rather than altogether jettison) "the political idea, or more specifically, the political concept, as the central unit of analysis."[1] Drawing upon the work of W.B. Gallie, Freeden takes issue with precisely the sorts of approaches Marder cites for overlooking the "essential contestability" of political concepts -- i.e., the extent to which such concepts lack "a clearly definable general . . . or correct use" and, for this reason, are pervious to "inevitably endless disputes about their meaning."[2] Although Freeden, like Marder, clearly acknowledges that the set of possible meanings ascribable to political concepts exceeds "what can be expressed in any single definition," he does not take this to imply that they are altogether useless (or worse) for political thinking.[3] The problem for Freeden, again, is not with concepts or conceptual analysis, but with approaches that fail to account for the variability and mutability that concepts evince.

Freeden's proposes thinking of concepts as clusters or assemblages of ideational components, the internal configuration of which is never fixed. Although the meaning of a political concept in a given context is a function of this configuration (which is itself a function of the surrounding context, including the context within which that concept is related to other concepts), no political concept has, or can have, a single "meaning" independently of a particular ideational "morphology" (which, again, is always context-dependent and open to a seemingly endless array of variations and mutations). As Freeden himself notes, "concepts do not have fixed and determinate cores, though . . . concrete instances of concepts may display a core as a structural rather than substantial feature (my italics)."[4] Understood in this way, political concepts are very much like Marder's "folds" and "complications"; they cannot but be plural because they arise within, and in response to, a multiplicity of different political realities, all of which are anchored in different historical and cultural contexts. As Freeden writes by way of summary:

The building blocks of political thought are the political concepts . . . that constitute its main foci. Ideologies are the complex constructs through which specific meanings, out of a potentially unlimited and essentially contestable universe of meanings, are imparted to the wide range of political concepts they inevitably employ. Political concepts acquire meaning not only through historically transferred traditions of discourse, and not only through the pluralist disparities of culture, but also through their particular location within a constellation of other political concepts.[5]

The point, in any case, is that Freeden has at least made an attempt at developing a non-reductive mode of conceptual thinking that makes no pretense toward exhausting the "various dimensions" of "the thing itself." As such, it may be advisable for Marder to engage with or at least take account of this sort of enterprise in articulating and defending his own views.

All of this being said, I can attest without the slightest hesitation that this is a remarkable book -- one of the most challenging and thought-provoking I have encountered in a very long time and, for this reason alone, richly deserving of attention. In a field that often appears inert and stagnant, Political Concepts is more than just a "breath of fresh air"; it is an invitation to political thinkers to fundamentally reconsider what we are doing and how we do it. I cannot recommend it strongly enough.

[1] See Michael Freeden, Ideologies and Political Theory: A Conceptual Approach (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1996), especially chapter 2.

[2] W.B. Gallie, "Essentially Contested Concepts," Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society 56 (1955-56): 168-169.

[3] Michael Freeden, "Political Concepts and Ideological Morphology," The Journal of Political Philosophy vol. 2, no. 2 (1994): 141.

[4] Freeden, Ideologies and Political Theory, 53-54.

[5] Ibid., 54.