Political Emotions: Why Love Matters for Justice

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Martha C. Nussbaum, Political Emotions: Why Love Matters for Justice, Harvard University Press, 2013, 457pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674724655.

Reviewed by Helga Varden, University of Illinois at Urbana-Champaign


Martha Nussbaum’s capability theory of justice belongs to the tradition of “political liberalism” in legal-political philosophy. “Political liberalism” refers to John Rawls’s later philosophy (indeed, his post-A Theory of Justice [TJ] work on domestic justice was published as Political Liberalism [PL]). In Political Emotions, Nussbaum engages core questions about the relationship between political stability and moral psychology (or, the emotions). Rawls considers these questions in the final section of TJ (entitled “Ends”), but never revisited them in the light of his later ideas of political liberalism. Nussbaum thus proposes a theory of political love (and its affiliated emotions) that addresses these questions in a manner consistent with the spirit of political liberalism, and so in a way that Rawls himself might have wanted. Before directly engaging some of Nussbaum’s ideas, I provide a brief overview of the philosophical context for her book and of its content.

Theorists belonging to the tradition of political liberalism affirm a core idea from Rawls’s later philosophy, namely that a state fundamentally committed to justice -- understood in terms of freedom and equality -- leaves its citizens’ “comprehensive doctrines” alone. A comprehensive doctrine is any set of deeply held ethical, religious, or metaphysical views about the good life. A liberal society committed to ideals of freedom and equality strives to ensure, the argument goes, that its public justifications for the state’s legitimate coercive power do not invoke principles or arguments that conflict with any citizen’s reasonable comprehensive doctrine. An important consequence of this is that the grasp of the state’s coercive power also does not conflict with any citizen’s reasonable comprehensive doctrine. Being a reasonable citizen, correspondingly, means respecting every other citizen’s equal right to a comprehensive doctrine, and so requires one to discuss matters pertaining to the state’s coercive power only in terms of the liberal, political ideas constitutive of liberal societies. Hence, being a full citizen in a liberal society is fully compatible with holding any type of religious, ethical, or metaphysical view -- irrespective of the wisdom of that view -- as long as it’s a reasonable version of this view; citizenship in a liberal society only demands that people treat each other as free and equal citizens in this way. Consequently, in a diverse, pluralistic liberal society (one characterized by the “fact of reasonable pluralism,” in Rawls’s term), all use of state power is understandable, justifiable, and affirmable by any citizen who interacts with fellow citizens in this way, that is, by any reasonable citizen.

Rawls’s dissatisfaction with the degree to which he incorporated this normative fact about the justification of state coercion in liberal societies in TJ (1971) led him to revise some of those ideas in subsequent papers, which were ultimately collected and published as Political Liberalism (1993). In the latter, he suggests that his original theory of justice as fairness (as it appeared in TJ) should be understood as a comprehensive doctrine. Moreover, he maintains, the work culminating in PL transforms the comprehensive doctrine of justice as presented in TJ into a “liberal, political conception of justice,” meaning that all its core normative ideas are now formulated in terms of only the liberal, political ideas constitutive of modern, liberal democracies. Consequently, his liberal, political conception of justice as fairness is affirmable by any reasonable citizen (regardless of that citizen’s particular comprehensive doctrine). In the introduction to the paperback edition of PL released a few years later (1996), Rawls clarifies that he considers his liberal, political conception of justice as fairness as belonging to a family of such conceptions that co-exist in a liberal society. Much scholarship over the past couple of decades has been devoted to understanding these particular amendments to Rawls’s project of “justice as fairness,” and to incorporating them into the framework of other theories. As Nussbaum clarifies at the beginning of her book, she regards her own “capability” theory of justice as one member of this family of liberal, political conceptions of justice, and as such affirmable by any reasonable citizen of a liberal society.

Recently, liberal scholars have paid increasing attention to the question of what a political theory must exclude when it adopts (as many do) this reasonableness-aspect of Rawls’s later work. The question entails three parts: first, the proper justification in legal-political theory; second, legitimate public discussion and engagement; and third, Rawls’s later move toward political liberalism in relation to the final part of TJ (“Ends”). In the latter, as aforementioned, Rawls discusses the stability of a just state in relation to concerns about moral psychology (such as the problem of envy), among others. As Nussbaum emphasizes (9), Rawls himself does not revise this aspect of his 1971 version of justice as fairness in PL or in any other later works, beyond occasionally remarking that such an account is required by a liberal, political conception of justice and that his original (1971) theory needs revision along these “reasonableness” lines.

Nussbaum takes up all three questions. In response to the first two, she provides an independent account of how love matters for legal political theory and for public reason and engagement. In response to the third, she argues that her account can also be seen as one suggestion for how to develop Rawls’s later philosophy so that it not only bears on his earlier work in “Ends,” but also overcomes some “rationalistic” worries she has in relation to Rawls’s original 1971 account of political stability and moral psychology. By engaging this important aspect of liberal (includingRawlsian) political thought, Nussbaum also engages important issues in the dispute concerning so-called ideal vs. non-ideal theory. The latter discussion concerns a twofold worry regarding ideal theory. First, the worry is that much liberal thought fails to engage real societies in a practical way, since it only ever tries to sketch the ideal towards which we should strive. Hence, ideal theory does not properly engage our very non-ideal realities, neither on the individual nor the state level. Many object, therefore, that we do not need more ideal theory: after all, when judged against the ideal of any of these liberal theories, or even just common sense, we still fail dramatically. Perhaps we should focus instead on the darker parts of humanity, and build institutions that protect each of us a little better against them.

Second, the worry is that by searching for the human ideal, liberal thought focuses only on shared aspects of humanity and ignores the fact that our particular societies and states differ widely based on our very different histories. For example, from where I sit right now in St. Andrews, one might see out the window Scottish men wearing kilts. Scottish people see this practice as profoundly lovable, playful, sexy or erotic, and life-affirming (a description in line with the one Nussbaum probably would have given had she used this example in her book). But these loving emotions in regard to the practice of wearing kilts are not readily accessible for the rest of us from a first-personal point of view; to experience those emotions, we have to be immersed in the practice for a little while at least. Preferably, we would see kilts on someone we love already, like a Scottish man (indeed, loving a Scottish man probably includes coming to love this side of him). It would be a fun project, obviously, but a project nonetheless for non-Scottish people. Experiencing all the right emotions in response to kilts is therefore tricky for non-Scottish people. And since it’s so easy to hurt and disrespect people if one relates to this national and political side of them in the wrong way, time and caring guidance are typically prerequisites for getting it right. More generally, the worry is that ideal theory’s focus on our shared aspects does not properly attend to or capture what sets us apart, as individuals and as political societies. And although some of the non-shared features of individuals and societies are “quirky” (one of Nussbaum’s favorite words for non-shared features), they are some of the aspects of ourselves and others that we love the most. Kilts are very much part of what it is to be Scottish, for example. Despite these being unshared features -- and in some ways weird -- they are also strangely loveable and deeply meaningful.

In Nussbaum’s view, a distinct virtue of Rawls’s work in the final part of TJ is that it addresses some of these issues concerning non-ideal theory. But she agrees with Rawls that his account in “Ends” needs revision to be fully compatible with political liberalism’s ideals. Additionally, she finds the account in “Ends” running the danger of seeming too ideal or “rationalistic.” Hence, despite the fact that Rawls engages moral emotions, like envy, that are important for a political theory of stability, Nussbaum views it as a fair worry that he pays too little attention to our affective and quirky nature as well as to our truly nasty sides. She aims to rectify both in her account by showing how (political) love embraces our quirkiness while also doing important work with regard to our dark sides by helping us stabilize our political societies and strive towards a more just world.

Political Emotions, then, is divided into three parts. In Part I, “History,” Nussbaum explains which aspects of relevant historical philosophical and musical texts she views as central to a satisfactory account of non-ideal stability. Because there isn’t enough help in Rawls’s own work or contemporary theory, and because this “non-ideal” political theory engages the quirky as well as the truly dark sides of human nature, Nussbaum searches in new places to investigate the issues and to clarify her approach and claims. To help us see the importance as well as the character of healthy love of one’s country, why affectionate love (with its affiliated emotions, like compassion and sympathy) is needed in addition to justice (with its affiliated emotions, like respect), she first goes to Mozart. She sets the stage in the first chapter by demonstrating two very different ways of understanding how the stage comedy The Marriage of Figaro (written by Pierre Beaumarchais and politically very controversial in its day) was brought to life in opera form by Mozart (who wrote the music) and Lorenzo Da Ponte (who wrote the Italian libretto, or text). Especially important here are the contrasts between the male and female characters (with Cherubino). For Nussbaum the male characters represent the traditional values of justice, whereas the female characters point towards the idea of civic love she is after, the one deemed central to stabilize just societies, including by the way in which it captures playfulness, forgiveness, vulnerability, and affectionate friendship. She proceeds to clarify the philosophical issues and challenges at hand by engaging relevant philosophers, especially Comte, Herder, J.S. Mill, and Tagore (and especially their work on the relationship between religion and the construction of states), as well as Rousseau and Kant.

In Part II, “Goals, Resources, Problems,” Nussbaum continues to demarcate our justice-seeking projects. She aims to identify the emotional resources available, to draw attention to the relevant kinds of problems the quirky and nasty aspects of our nature create, and to explain the way in which the project as a whole stays within the basic normative commitments of political liberalism. To fill in seemingly intractable gaps of the theories discussed in part I, as well as Rawls’ theory she draws on her own work in moral psychology and the moral emotions, as well as research from experimental psychology dealing with humans and non-human animals which display complex behavior.

In Part III, “Public Emotions,” Nussbaum illustrates and further elaborates on key features of her account with interpretations of related aspects of the two particular states she loves and knows best: the U.S. and India. The aim is to indicate how great American and Indian political figures and public projects have sought to inspire public emotions of a stabilizing and justice-seeking kind through their exercise of political influence. Included are illustrations of the aspirations and work of key political leaders such as George Washington, Abraham Lincoln, Franklin D. Roosevelt, and Martin Luther King, Jr. from the U.S., and Mahatma Gandhi and Jawaharlal Nehru from India. These illustrations also deal with how they have addressed atrocities and grave injustices committed towards segments of the populations in the name of respect for and love of their country. In this part, Nussbaum also proposes ways to understand how various aspects of educational systems and public art (national monuments, memorials, and city planning) express, aid, and foster citizens’ projects of loving and working on their countries in the right kind of way, namely, in the way that furthers its striving towards a more just and stable future, not only for itself but for all of humanity.

Political Emotions is, in other words, a long and rich book. And as all of Nussbaum’s books, it is deeply engaging, fun to read, filled to the rim with interesting arguments and reflections, beautifully written in addition to creating a space in which it is safe and good to think about some truly difficult and charged topics. Since it’s simply impossible to do justice to the very many themes and issues raised in the book within the scope of such a short review, I start by asking one general question concerning the relationship between public and non-public emotions. I then raise two questions concerning Nussbaum’s claim that “Each political ideal is supported by its own distinctive emotions,” (115) and in particular the way in which the political ideal of political liberalism is seen as inconsistent with those of monarchies and libertarianism.

The first question to which I’m struggling to find the answer in her book is how (if at all) Nussbaum draws the distinction and envisions the relationship between public and private emotions. For example, in her opening discussion of Mozart, the ability to forgive is (correctly, in my view) seen as central to affectionate personal loving relations. Yet it’s not clear, to me, exactly how public officials and political leaders, on Nussbaum’s theory, should relate to issues of forgiveness given her commitments to political liberalism. After all, it seems plausible to argue that at least in cases where a particular citizen has been subjected to injustice, the question of whether or not this person should forgive her wrongdoer is a matter to be settled by the wronged person’s deeply held ethical and religious convictions as well as a question of what this person can do. If so, however, then the question of forgiveness, at least in these cases, is one political leaders should leave alone or be silent about.

One place where this issue arises specifically is in relation to Nussbaum’s discussion of a controversy surrounding what Lincoln said in his Second Inaugural Address. Nussbaum considers two common interpretations of this speech. On the one hand, some argue that in this speech an

urgent need for reconciliation . . . led Lincoln to stress a nonjudgmental attitude of forgiveness prematurely. . . . On the other hand . . . [some find that] the speech is actually shrewd and also generous, rising above partisanship and seeking reconciliation, trying to create a united "us" once again, while continuing to blame the South. (234)

Why, I wonder, doesn’t Nussbaum take a definite stand on what Lincoln at least should have said? I’m not sure if Nussbaum thinks that a general theory of political love cannot or should not answer this question.

In addition, in my view, if Lincoln’s speech was consistent with the ideals of political liberalism, then he argued along the lines of the second interpretive option. If so, then he did not, as he should not, try to put pressure on those citizens who had been gravely wronged by slavery or by the civil war to let love of others -- and so love’s companions, compassion and forgiveness -- do the work of justice. Instead of saying that people ought to forgive and have compassion for their wrongdoers, Lincoln simply identified as legitimate the moral resentment of those who had been wronged, and then, having acknowledge this and not urging those wronged to forgive their wrongdoers, he appealed to the people to show love and compassion for the nation (to let affective love do its stabilizing work) and to interact respectfully (in line with each others’ rights). From the point of view of political liberalism, the important point is that he acknowledged the injustice as well as appealed to love and compassion in a way respectful of people’s reasonable comprehensive doctrines, namely by leaving it (in perpetuity) to each person to decide on the issue of whether or not to forgive their wrongdoers (exactly in accordance with their own comprehensive ethical and religious convictions). In this way Lincoln combined justice and love, by appealing to a general, affective love of country as well as respect for the principles of justice in an effort to facilitate healing and moving forward as one nation. To me, this seems to be what the normative ideals of political liberalism require of public officials in situations such as these.[1]

My second question concerns Nussbaum’s view that monarchies are inconsistent with the ideals of political liberalism. Like most of my North American friends and colleagues, Nussbaum cannot make good sense of European monarchies. In her view, the main problem is their political ideal and corresponding emotions, namely that “Monarchies have long relied on cultivating emotions of childlike dependency, encouraging subjects to depend on the king as on a quasi-divine father.” (115) Limited to the monarchies I know, the European ones, this description does not ring true. I don’t think the reason why Norwegians, Swedes, Danes, and the British, for example, have not chosen to abolish their monarchies is that we like being treated like children, and I don’t think our monarchs typically think of their roles in this parental way either. This is of course not to say that we might not choose to change this part of our nations or that these parts of our countries are also still works in progress, but the account of why we haven’t yet abolished them is more complex and reasonable. I believe the better kinds of interpretations of this quirky element of our nations maintain that it has something to do with inherited aspects of who we are (our histories).

To illustrate, take Norway, the monarchy I call home. Norwegians commonly view the nation as first unified into one monarchy (or the starting point of this unification process) in the year 885 CE. That we are comfortable with the way in which we have separated the “love-aspect” of our commitment to our country (royalty) from the “justice-aspect” (prime minister) derives from this historical fact of unification. It’s in part because of our history that it is not so obvious to us that we want to fuse these two roles into one, as in the American president (as so aptly described by Nussbaum in her book), but still choose to keep them apart. And there are advantages to our approach too. For example, it’s stabilizing to have someone (who feels up to the task, and usually insofar as they actually are up to it) who is trained and well-honed to function as a continuous non-partisan political partner in dialogue for any political leaders, who does not her- or himself have actual political power (beyond, typically, very limited and overridable veto powers), and who does this continuously for decades. It is also stabilizing to have someone enabling and giving expression to healthy love of country for everyone (independent of their political affiliation), including by honoring citizens for national efforts or by taking leading roles in supporting the citizens in times of wars and national tragedies.

Still, these advantages are not why we do it or why we haven’t yet changed it. Indeed, these good, stabilizing elements can be sought in other ways. The why is probably that realizing these aspects of political life in part tracks the history of the nation in important ways as well as fulfilling these stabilizing functions in good ways. Moreover, it’s not as if we think of the monarchy as necessary, uncontroversial, or required of anyone (royals can abdicate and live as private persons). Neither do we think it is suitable for any nation (regardless of history), or that it doesn’t come with its own problems in addition to some problems shared with others (such as the problems associated with having particularly klutzy presidents). It’s also considered an incomplete project. For example, in my view, the next major improvement surely must concern the Norwegian royal family’s formal connection with a particular religion, which (if things go well) will go by the wayside with the state church in Norway. And, of course, we do have a lot of humor about this side of us -- we recognize it as in some ways quirky -- even if it’s typically most funny when we are the ones making the jokes. In sum, although it seems to me that this part of the Norwegian nation should be accounted for in terms of non-ideal theory or moral psychology (a historical-cultural fact that ideal theory can make space for), I do not see why it cannot in principle be considered a fundamentally healthy and justifiable part of the Norwegian state.

Finally, I find myself resisting the idea that the libertarian political ideal and emotions are fundamentally inconsistent with those of political liberalism. The reason Nussbaum thinks there is such an incompatibility is a result of the way in which the liberal state of political liberalism goes beyond the libertarian minimal state by its characteristic commitment to social and economic justice. She argues that to succeed in stabilizing such socio-economic projects theories committed to the ideals of political liberalism are necessarily “far more concerned with the extension of sympathy needed to sustain such programs” than libertarians are. (123, cf. 122-24, 115-117) It’s the idea of state cultivation of “extended sympathy,” she suspects, that any libertarian will reject since it involves “intrusive and uncertain projects of improvement” of the people (116).

In my view, however, it remains to be seen where the libertarians end up regarding issues of socio-economic theory as a matter of ideal theory. Where they land will depend, I suspect, on how they ultimately deal with issues concerning systemic injustice as well as the rights of the sick, the disabled, and children. Hence, assuming (which, as we saw above, I’m not sure I’m right to) that Nussbaum agrees that loving or affectionate emotions like sympathy, love, and compassion cannot and should not do the work of moral emotions like anger and moral resentment in response to injustices, and assuming that love stabilizes justice in good ways, the extent to which sympathy is compatible with libertarianism will depend on how extensive these institutions of justice turn out to be on the libertarian (ideal) theories.

Let me try to illustrate this last point by means of an example concerning poverty that Nussbaum gives significant attention to, namely Roosevelt’s efforts to inspire Americans to partake in the New Deal through photographs and speeches (249f, 282-4). We could read his efforts in two very different ways: On the one hand, we can see Roosevelt as calling upon Americans’ compassion and extended sympathy (as such) for America in general and the poor in particular. On this reading, his aim isn’t to draw Americans’ attention to injustice of any sort, but to the need to love and have compassion for the nation by supporting the New Deal. But if so, then libertarians will respond that Roosevelt was wrong to make such appeals because such projects should be undertaken as voluntary projects, projects of charity, and so not be undertaken in the name of the state-organized coercive, redistributive justice project the New Deal was. From this libertarian point of view, the problem with the New Deal is that the state has no right to enforce such economic projects in the name of love of the state and justice. Hence, if this is what Nussbaum took Roosevelt to be doing as part of showing how love can be utilized to support justice, and sometimes the way she writes pushes me in this direction, then libertarians will always resist -- and I believe they’d be right to resist.

On the other hand, we can argue differently -- and some of Nussbaum’s descriptions lead me to think this is her view. We can argue that Roosevelt was trying to show Americans the changed reality they were facing: By the 1930s, Americans could no longer move somewhere else to get means or acquire an un-owned piece of land (like the first settlers took themselves to be able to do, though sometimes wrongly). These options were no longer available to newcomers, to factory workers, and to other poor people; there was nowhere to go. America was becoming, for the first time in its history, a place where very many became dependent on (the new economic and financial) systems in order to access means legally, and these systems were themselves in trouble. That is to say, economic systems of free trade are at the heart of justice understood in terms of freedom, and yet it became evident that they can fail to realize freedom (though typically through no one individual’s fault or wrongdoing) under certain conditions unless we take certain institutional steps to secure them and the people whose exercise of freedom is subjected to them. Only in this way can we reconcile their role with each citizen’s right to be free, or to have their exercise of freedom fundamentally independent of the choices of other private persons in the right way. And only systemic solutions to poverty -- systemic welfare protections, and the New Deal was perhaps the first major US effort in this regard -- can ensure that. Under these systemic conditions, securing everyone’s basic economic rights is therefore not a matter of charity, sympathy, or compassion, but a matter of not participating in or permitting systemic wrongdoing. In other words, the first American settlers did not have this type of duty of justice since it’s not a duty that private persons have in relation to each other; it’s a kind of duty that we have only as citizens of states under certain systemic conditions. But if so, then the relevant core moral emotions tracking these basic economic rights include respect, moral resentment, and anger. Moreover, once the proper role is given to justice and its moral emotions, then, of course, other moral emotions, like compassion and sympathy can play their proper roles and general love for one’s country can be appealed to by encouraging people to have affection and support for “basically good [existing] institutions” as well as institutions that are to be “shortly realized” (23).

In sum, then, if libertarians can accept this argument concerning poverty as a systemic problem in the context of modern states as a matter of ideal theory, then they can also agree with this second reading of Roosevelt’s New Deal and their theories can be seen as belonging to the family of liberal, political conceptions of justice. Moreover, how extensive the socio-economic institutions should be in a just state, including whether other issues (like health and education) should also be treated as concerns of systemic injustice in such contexts, would then remain a matter of reasonable disagreement. Hence, libertarians may be more restrictive here (as they commonly are in, for example, Scandinavian politics), but their policies will not be unreasonable.

Finally, it seems worth pointing out that Nussbaum agrees with libertarians in resisting the idea that one can use state coercion to create love or sympathy (of any kind). Where Nussbaum and libertarians disagree may be on any idea of cultivating “extended sympathy” through projects financed by tax money. Then again, I’m not sure whether such public projects must be seen as justified because they cultivate extended sympathy (although they have this effect), rather than, for example, because they are ways in which we publicly honor national heroes, victims of severe injustice, and make cities livable places through public parks and artwork. It is, in other words, not clear to me that libertarians couldn’t agree with the correctness of many of the public projects Nussbaum discusses in Political Emotions. And even if some of these projects take us beyond what libertarians can agree with, because they are democrats, they can (pragmatically) accept some yielding to the majority view here. For these reasons, perhaps libertarian theories need not necessarily conflict with political liberalism’s normative ideals.[2]

[1] The Kantian I find to write the best on these issues, though in the context of South Africa, is Lucy Allais (“Retributive Justice, Restorative Justice, and the South African Truth and Reconciliation Commission,” Philosophy and Public Affairs, 39 (4), 2011). She similarly argues that the TRC isn’t about forgiveness, but about addressing issues of justice and moral resentment under conditions where trials of justice for all those affected were de facto impossible because of the lack of evidence and the enormous amount of wrongdoing. Hence, those wronged could choose to have truth told instead of a trial, and no one required or expected to forgive. This, of course, is also completely consistent with also seeing Mandela (like Lincoln, on my reading) as appealing to everyone’s affectionate love for South Africa and moral love (respect) for its true moral ideals (freedom and equality for all) -- with corresponding moral and affectionate compassion -- as they move forward together.

[2] Thanks to Nancy Abelmann, Ingrid Albrecht, Lucy Allais, Barbara Sattler, David Sussman, and Shelley Weinberg for patiently helping me think through many themes in this review.