Political Philosophy: An Introduction

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Richard G. Stevens, Political Philosophy: An Introduction, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 309pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521169011.

Reviewed by Peter Simpson, The City University of New York


Richard G. Stevens, a retired professor from National Defense University, begins his book by questioning whether it is really worth reading. The books in philosophy that are worth reading, he says, are the greatest books, the primary texts of those who were really philosophers; and there are maybe only a few hundred or several dozen of them. Secondary texts can, he also says, mislead as well as numb the mind of the student; they have their uses as aids, but they must be read with "caution and respectful skepticism" (xi). The same goes for the primary texts. Indeed, one of Stevens' complaints is that many of the greatest of the primary modern texts in political philosophy are misleading and have numbed the modern mind. With this sort of introduction, then, to Stevens' Political Philosophy: An Introduction (a secondary text, after all), we have to wonder whether, besides taking us away from the primary texts, it will not mislead and numb us.

What does Stevens think the value of his Introduction is? Its value is its power for effecting a revival in the modern American academy which, since the end of the nineteenth century, has gone from mediocre to bad to pretty appalling (xv-xx). Political philosophy "has one foot in the grave unless those properly drawn to it can receive some direction to its point of entry; some encouragement in fact to enter and then to study; some guidance in that study … That guidance and encouragement are the purposes of this book" (xix). His book, then, hardly has the "modest aim" he claims for it. Admittedly he does not think he is going to revive many. Most students do not have what it takes and should, instead, be given "gentle and generous direction to the exit" (xix).

The first chapter opens thus: "Authors who are not frivolous give careful thought to the titles of their books and of the chapters of their books" (3). Stevens' book has as title 'Political Philosophy: An Introduction'. Its chapters are ten and divided into three parts. Part I has the title 'The Nature and Origin of Political Philosophy' and has four chapters: 'What Philosophy Is', 'The Origin of Philosophy', 'The Nature of Politics', and 'The Origin of Political Philosophy'. Part II has the title 'The Problem of Political Philosophy' and has two chapters: 'The Best City' and 'Moderation', but it is prefaced by an 'Introduction to Part II' which is not called a chapter. Part III has the title 'The Permutations of Political Philosophy' and has four chapters: 'Ancient and Medieval Political Philosophy', 'A Kind of Betrayal', 'Modern Political Philosophy and Post-modern Thought', and 'Ancients and Moderns'. So we find that Philosophy has a What and an Origin but that Politics has only a Nature while Political Philosophy has an Origin and a Nature (at any rate as to its part if not as a chapter), but does not have a What. The Problem of Political Philosophy appears to be two problems, one concerning the Best City and one concerning Moderation (only these two?). The Permutations of Political Philosophy has three or four or two parts as well as a Betrayal. Its parts are Ancient and Medieval and Modern, or Ancient and Medieval and Modern and Postmodern, or Ancient and Modern. Its betrayal is only a kind of betrayal and so either is not really a betrayal or there are other sorts of betrayals which it does not have. What are we supposed to conclude? Is Stevens being frivolous or not?

On the next page, one finds the following: "As Michael Gillespie asserts, 'Martin Heidegger was the first philosopher since Plato and Aristotle seriously to consider the question of being.'" (4). According to Heidegger, Aristotle and Plato started the rot by making people forget being and the world had to wait for Heidegger to remember it again. To accept Heideggerian ontology is, as Stevens points out, to accept history or historicity: everything has a history, including being, but nothing has a nature that survives or transcends history. If there is no unchanging nature or being, there is no truth or falsehood either, because there is nothing that stays the same long enough to measure truth or falsehood by.

Is Stevens agreeing with Gillespie and buying into Heideggerian ontology? He says not, but we can test that claim by asking what he thinks about certain other things. He speaks of the derivation of the word philosophy from the Greek words for wisdom and love: philo-sophy means the desire of wisdom and not the possession of it (6). Stevens is repeating old wives' tales, specifically Diotima's old wife's tale from Plato's Symposium. The Symposium is about eros, not philia, and if either of these words connotes the desiring of something one does not yet have, it is eros and not philia. Eros means erotic love, which is very often a longing for what one does not have; philia means friendship and is the enjoyment of what one already has. Friendship also betokens equality, so a philosopher is literally someone who is equal friends with wisdom, or someone who is wise and is not merely longing for it (Aristotle, Metaphysics 1.2). In the Symposium Plato is engaging in a sort of joke, making it seem as if 'philosophy' has been misspelled for 'erosophy'. He makes the joke clearer at the end by introducing an erosopher, Alcibiades, someone who had eros for wisdom or at least for a wise man, and could never get it or him, and who was, as a result, no philosopher. Has Stevens missed the joke? Or is he, à la Heidegger perhaps, translating Greek terms the way he wants (because meaning is no more unchanging than being)?

Someone else who missed the joke, or translated terms the way he wanted, was Stevens' favorite teacher, Leo Strauss, to whose memory he dedicates the book. Strauss seems to have done the most, at least in the US and during the years when, according to Stevens, US education was turning rotten, to spread the myth that philosophers, by definition, love wisdom but never get it. The ramifications of the myth are profound, both in fact and in Stevens' book. Take his definition of philosophy, written in bold (twice): "philosophy is the free and radical pursuit by means of unassisted human reason of the truth about … " (14, 18). Forget about the 'about'; note the repetition of the myth (philosophy is pursuit, not possession); note more the introduction of 'unassisted human reason'. What is meant by 'unassisted'? Unassisted by books, by friends, by logic, by evidence, by old wives' tales? No, says Stevens, unassisted by God or divine revelation. Try finding that among ancient philosophers. Parmenides? No, the goddess revealed to him the mysteries of being. Socrates? No, the god at Delphi revealed to him that he was wisest and set him on his life's task. Plato? No, because according to his 7th letter philosophy cannot be written down but comes by mystical vision of the divine (the same with Plotinus). Aristotle? No, because the god that moves the cosmos also moves, through divination, the mind of the wise to wisdom as he moves the desires of the unreasoning to success (Eudemian Ethics 8.2).

So from whom does this idea of philosophy as unassisted reason come? No surprises if you guessed Leo Strauss. In his chapter on Ancient and Medieval Political Philosophy, Stevens refers to Strauss on Maimonides' Guide of the Perplexed: "The first premise of the book, says Strauss, is 'the old Jewish premise that being a Jew and being a philosopher are incompatible things'" (182). But if, heeding Stevens' advice, one looks at the primary source and not the secondary source he quotes from, one will be hard pressed to find that premise anywhere in the Guide, stated or implied. One would be hard pressed to find it in other Jewish philosophers. One would also be hard pressed to find the equivalent in Muslim philosophers: not Averroes and Alfarabi certainly, who both make it clear that only they and the people are true followers of the Prophet and the Koran, while the soi disant theologians are infidels (the point is real and profound, but Stevens numbs and misleads about it; 173, 177-78). One would be hard pressed, finally, to find the equivalent of Strauss' premise in Christian philosophers such as Aquinas, or Scotus, or Augustine (and forget Justin Martyr, for whom to become a Christian is to become a philosopher and is the only way to become a philosopher). Possibly it lurks in Siger of Brabant and the Latin Averroists, but even so it is not in Averroes himself.

Stevens is repeating Strauss' myth. Why? Can he not think for himself but has to repeat the dogma his teacher handed down? Perhaps I am being unfair. Stevens is capable of inventing myths of his own. In the chapter where he repeats Strauss' myth, he offers "the sketchiest account" of the three religions mentioned (162). As for Christianity, he talks about Jesus but not about Christ and says that Jesus was not a Christian; Jesus did not come to found a new religion but to reform an existing one. Stevens blames the followers of Jesus for making what Jesus said into a new religion. He blames Christianity, and also Islam, for making the tension between religion and philosophy too obvious (164). He does not mention that Jesus was crucified and rose from the dead, thereby proving himself Son of God and Christ. Nor does he mention that Christians do not think Christianity a new religion but the fulfillment of the prophecies given by God to Moses. Nor does he mention that Christian and Muslim philosophers have, almost to a man, found religion and philosophy in perfect harmony. Fair enough, Stevens does not believe any of those things. But he is summarizing what the religions themselves believe, not what he believes, and his summary of Christian belief is not just incomplete, it is guilty of "grievous oversight" (his own words about summarizing Hamlet without mentioning Hamlet, 197). Actually it repeats part of the explanation for Christianity given by Talmudists. But Talmudists have an excuse: they are not summarizing what Christians believe; they are explaining Christianity, like everything else, from the perspective of the Talmud. Stevens has no excuse. He is explaining Christianity as it historically was and is to educationally deprived students in order to introduce them to political philosophy. But it cannot be that Stevens is so ignorant of Christianity as not to know what it says of itself.

We already know, then, that Stevens, like Strauss, is capable of spreading myths about what philosophy means, about what the philosophers and religious think of the compatibility of philosophy and religion, and (on his own part) about what Christianity is. One is reminded of what he indicates about Nietzsche (265-76). Power is truth (Bacon's 'knowledge is power' is only the first half of the story), for it determines truth, or at any rate what the few powerful can get the many powerless to think is truth. How many of Stevens' undergraduates, over whom he wields professorial power, will pick up the myths he passes on, as above all that religion and philosophy, faith and reason, are incompatible? How many will go home and live as practical atheists (and not, thank goodness, as serious Christians or Muslims or Jews, save perhaps for outward ritual observance)? How many, further, will get intrigued by Stevens' technique (the knowledge that gives him the power that determines the truth he passes on), but be unable to question the dogmas? How many will learn to imitate him in passing on these dogmas as a conspiratorial or secret teaching (xiii), by reading the same dogmas, through clever word play, into any book, especially any old book, they pick up? How many, in short, will become Straussians (and dogmatically so, in the way Nietzsche thought people had to be if they were going to live at all, 270)? Strauss, it should be added, was not a Straussian. He was a Machiavellian founder. Strauss was very successful. Stevens' book is an illustration (though there are many other illustrations out there).

Such is the overall message of Stevens' book. Of course there is more in it than I have mentioned. A lot of it is indeed acceptable and informative (though derivative, as he himself concedes). Some of it is even surprising, as his repeating the story (from late but not wholly unreliable sources) that the great library of Alexandria was destroyed in 642 AD by the invading Muslim Arabs (161). One does not hear that story told very often (most of the time people say it was destroyed by Caesar or by a Christian mob at the time of Cyril). He also indicates, if only in a footnote (189n), that it was Rome and not Athens that made the world Greek. Were Straussians to take that fact seriously they might stop talking of the tension between Athens and Jerusalem and talk instead of the unity that is Rome -- but, alas, they won't be able to; it would upset too many of their apple carts.

These curiosities aside, the book is otherwise just faithful Straussian dogma (one of postmodernity's new religions). It is more of sociological than philosophical interest.