Political Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: Authors and Argument

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Catherine H. Zuckert (ed.), Political Philosophy in the Twentieth Century: Authors and Arguments, Cambridge University Press, 2011, 280pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107006225.

Reviewed by Thad Williamson, University of Richmond


Political Philosophy in the Twentieth Century consists of essays on eighteen prominent twentieth-century political philosophers. According to the editor, Catherine Zuckert, the selected thinkers each addresses a paradigmatic question of political philosophy: "How can we best live, not merely as individuals, but also in communities that have to coexist, if not actively cooperate, in an ever more closely interrelated world?" (p. 2) This is surely the right question to ask, and anyone interested in pursuing it will benefit from -- and take pleasure in -- engaging with the answers suggested in this volume.

Despite the title, the writings of the authors selected do not literally encompass all of the twentieth century. Instead, the story picks up after World War I with Part I comprising essays on the writings of John Dewey, Carl Schmitt, and Antonio Gramsci. Part II consists of essays on post-World War II European émigrés Leo Strauss, Eric Voeglin, Yves Simon, and Hannah Arendt. Part III consists of essays on the varieties of liberalism espoused by F.A. Hayek, Michael Oakeshott, Isaiah Berlin, H.L.A. Hart, John Rawls and Richard Rorty. Part IV focuses on critics of mainstream liberal political theory: Jean-Paul Sartre, Michel Foucault, Jürgen Habermas, Alasdair MacIntyre, and Charles Taylor.

Each essay is carefully constructed, relatively short (ten to nineteen pages), and designed to convey the central ideas or arguments of the thinker in question. Given the length of the essays and the sheer volume of output of the subjects being considered, the authors are necessarily selective in the topics and texts considered. This is a book of thematic essays, not encyclopedia articles. Most essays contain at least some biographical information at their outset (although it is refreshing that no set template has been imposed on the form and structure of the essays), as well as (when relevant) explanation of the political controversies and struggles in which the subjects were engaged.

With one exception, the authors approach their subjects from a standpoint of critical sympathy, an approach they handle well. Tracy Strong's chapter on Schmitt, for instance, admirably handles the tricky task of explaining why exactly Schmitt's thought is worth studying and why thinkers appalled by Schmitt's support of Nazi rule have nevertheless been attracted to some of his concepts.

The exception in this regard is John Finnis's essay on Hart, which contains a contemptuous account of Hart's argumentation in Law, Liberty, and Morality (1963), characterized as a "dismaying triumph of confusion and error." (p. 179) Finnis argues that the book begins by misstating English law, then goes on to fault Hart for choosing as his interlocutor not the Platonic-Aristotelian or Thomistic positions on the morality of regulating moral behavior, but the "ruminations of an English judge of no philosophic formation, Patrick Devlin," in a debate he goes on to describe as "essentially unphilosophical." (pp. 180-81, 184) Whereas Strong's assessment of Schmitt recognizes him as a philosopher worthy of taking seriously, Finnis judges Hart's work and the influence he enjoyed as "a measure of the widespread loss of philosophical culture in the 104 years between On Liberty and Law, Liberty, and Morality." (p. 184)

On the one hand, Finnis's thorough dissection of Hart's argumentation adds a welcome bit of polemical spice to the volume, and more than most authors in the collection Finnis has gone beyond the immediate subject to try to say something substantive about the practice of political philosophy as a whole (which he views as a narrative of decay). On the other hand, the departure in tone from the rest of the volume in his essay makes one wonder if the point of including Hart as a subject was to present Hart's views or to provide Finnis with a suitable platform for expressing his critique of liberal political philosophy (and practice).

Be that as it may, the essays in this collection operate at a very high level. It seems fruitless, for a collection like this, to attempt further judgment on their intellectual merits. Such judgments will inevitably be subjective and heavily colored by one's own ideological and theoretical sympathies.

What I can say is that I found real value in essays about both those thinkers with whom I am in ideological and theoretical sympathy, and in essays about those operating in different ideological or theoretical space than my own work. In the former category, Joseph Buttigieg's essay on Gramsci, Dana Villa's essay on Arendt, and Paul Weithman's essay on Rawls each struck me as insightful, informative, and a source of clarity. Buttigieg's observation that for Gramsci, "a political movement cannot succeed unless the worldview that animates it is not only disseminated among the people but is also understood and consciously embraced by them," (pp. 55-56) is a pithy and on-point statement of both Gramsci's notion of hegemony and his account of the task of radical politics. Villa's essay navigates the various controversies of Arendt's career (defending her against what he views as scurrilous attacks, particularly regarding the Eichmann controversy) while convincingly identifying her work in The Human Condition as a seminal event in the late-twentieth century civic republican critique of modern politics. Weithman's essay focuses largely on Rawls's motivation in constructing his account of justice in a way that sheds welcome light on the role "ideal theory," recently much maligned in some quarters, might contribute to our understanding of politics. Rawls, according to Weithman, was moved by the need to show that a just society is possible, given plausible assumptions about human nature and how institutions work, and that it could be stable over time. If this is not the case, then the skeptical view dating back to Thrasymachus that the world is run by the powerful who construct discourses about justice to secure the compliance of others, cannot be answered by reason. Whether or not one believes Rawls's efforts in this regard were successful, Weithman's treatment here makes clear what is at stake.

Next I will comment on essays operating in different ideological or theoretical space than my own work. Both Eric Mack's essay on Hayek and Alan Milchman and Alan Rosenberg's essay on Foucault struck me as, in different ways, exceptionally useful summations of the central ideas in each thinker. From Hayek's vast oeuvre, Mack focuses on the foundational ideal of a spontaneously evolved, non-designed social order, resting on emergent social norms established to secure fruitful social cooperation. The conception of such an order, and the parallel distinction between "law" and "legislation," underwrites Hayek's critique of Hobbesian concepts of the state, as well as his view (also held by Oakeshott) that the state should be seen as one association among many, not as a director general for society as a whole. Mack's account will of course not convince Hobbesians, post-Marxists, and others inclined to think of the notion of a non-problematic social order emergent prior to the formation of the state as a pleasant fairy tale, but his chapter elegantly lays out the logic of Hayek's view.

Milchman and Rosenberg reverse conventional chronological accounts of Foucault's work by focusing on the "ethical politics of care of self and others" (p. 228) that Foucault was striving to develop at the end of his life. Here attention turns from Foucault's novel account of power to the possibility of developing constructive forms of agency in resistance to the "various modes of domination, discipline, and control." (p. 231) Foucault's project is thus described as involving "a critique of who we are, the subjects that we have historically become, and the possibilities of fashioning ourselves differently." (p. 230) This linkage of the question of power to the question of selves, ethics, and character puts the late Foucault in conversation with the ancients as well as with the practice of Athenian democracy -- and also, recognizably, in conversation with modern democratic theorists. Milchman and Rosenberg's account does a solid job of making Foucault's project legible to non-specialists for whom Foucault's distinctive method and language have made the content of his investigations somewhat opaque.

That example points to what should be one of the primary uses of this volume: to help students and scholars working in one sector of the contemporary Western political tradition to make sense of other, very different views. One imagines that this book will very quickly make it on the required reading list of graduate students in political theory and political philosophy preparing for general exams, and will be widely consulted by faculty preparing lectures on twentieth-century political thought or seeking a refresher on a thinker or topic not examined in some time. Yet the essays also are strong enough to command the respect of specialists on each thinker.

Precisely because this volume is likely to be widely read and used, however, it is worth critically reflecting both on its construction and on the tradition of political philosophy it represents. In particular, some commentary on the choice of thinkers and topics for a book claiming the authoritative title "Political Philosophy in the Twentieth Century" is inevitable. In the introduction, Zuckert lists a number of thinkers who "could and perhaps should have been included," (p. 15) among them Simone de Beauvoir. Beauvoir's inclusion would have assured some direct reflection on the question of gender, as well as served as a marker of one of the most fundamental social and political developments of the twentieth century, the dramatic challenges to traditional gender roles and the expansion of women's rights and participation in politics. That a chapter on Beauvoir was not included is indeed regrettable.

Equally inexplicable is the exclusion of any sustained engagement with questions of race (indeed, no thinker primarily concerned with race even makes Zuckert's "B" list of should-have-been-includeds). Insofar as race was one of the central, constitutive components of twentieth-century politics and the central pivot point for civic activism and debates over social change in the postwar United States, this exclusion is impossible to justify. Further, insofar as one of the main uses of this text will be (as noted above) to allow different parts of the political tradition to speak to one another, it would have been a great virtue if the volume had slightly broadened the conception of what it is to do political philosophy by including a social theorist like W.E.B. DuBois, Oliver Cromwell Cox, or Frantz Fanon -- or alternatively, an essay focused on the rich discussions of the meaning of democracy and by extension the political condition found in mid-century African-American authors such as James Baldwin, Ralph Ellison, and Richard Wright.

Despite these flaws, this estimable volume is a remarkable assemblage of diverse streams of thought. It also presents an opportunity for readers to reflect upon and critically evaluate the tradition and practice of political philosophy at the outset of a new century.

Perhaps for some thinkers covered in the book, the lonely-heroic vocation of the political philosopher reflecting at arm's length on the political condition, or speaking truth to an unwelcoming culture, can be embraced as a point of pride. And perhaps some political philosophers are entirely comfortable with the conventional division of labor between "philosophers" dealing in the realm of norms and ideas and "empiricists" dealing in the realm of institutions and concrete practices. Acceptance of this division implies a retreat by political philosophers from the critical work of wrestling with practical institutional issues and the fundamental question of what a workable and desirable regime for us would look like.

But as this volume also shows, such a truncated understanding of the task of political philosophy does not do justice to the richer connection between theorizing and practice evident in many of the century's most important theorists. Indeed, the volume helps remind us that political philosophers -- figures such as Dewey, Gramsci, and Arendt -- have had their largest impact on both the intellectual community and on the larger culture when they engaged personally and politically with the large issues (empirical, institutional, and moral) of their time, leaving nothing off the table.