Political Solidarity

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Sally J. Scholz, Political Solidarity, Penn State UP, 2008, 286pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780271034003.

Reviewed by Shelley Wilcox, San Francisco State University



Solidarity is widely invoked by activists and scholars, but philosophers have not given the concept the careful attention it deserves. Political Solidarity helps to remedy this lacuna in the philosophical literature by developing a distinctive theory of political solidarity that distinguishes political solidarity from similar forms of solidarity and elucidates its moral, political, social, and epistemological content. Lucidly written, theoretically interesting, and closely in touch with the real world, this book should be read by anyone interested in feminism, social ontology, political philosophy, or progressive politics.

Scholz begins by identifying three general characteristics shared by every type of solidarity. First, solidarity is a form of social unity that binds members together in an identifiable solidarity group, called a solidary. Second, solidarity mediates between the community and the individual, blending elements of communalism and individualism. The solidary is constituted by individuals, but it is a collective entity, not merely an aggregate of its parts. Finally, solidarity is a form of collective responsibility; members of a solidary have positive moral obligations to fellow members and in some cases beyond. These features of solidarity help to distinguish genuine solidarity from parasitical solidarity, which may evoke some of the feelings associated with solidarity but lacks at least one of its defining elements, typically moral duties. Parasitical solidarity is often used rhetorically, such as when one country claims to “stand in solidarity” with another country that has recently experienced a natural disaster yet offers little in the way of material aid.

Next Scholz develops a taxonomy of solidarities that identifies three distinct forms of solidarity: social, civil, and political. In social solidarity, the solidary is defined on the basis of characteristics that members share, such as a common identity, consciousness, or experience of oppression. These shared characteristics generate social bonds among solidary members, as well as positive collective moral obligations. The nature of these obligations is determined by the character of the solidary and its degree of cohesiveness. Highly cohesive social solidaries, such as families, entail extensive moral duties, whereas less cohesive solidaries, such as cultural groups, entail less extensive moral duties.

Civic solidarity generally refers to the relationship between the political state and its citizens. As in a social solidary, membership in a civic solidary entails positive moral obligations. By virtue of their citizenship, citizens have a collective responsibility to protect their fellow citizens against vulnerabilities, such as inadequate nutrition or healthcare, that would hinder their civic participation. These duties are typically carried out through formal state structures, e.g., redistributive institutions within a welfare state.

Scholz defines political solidarity as a unity of individuals who have made a conscious commitment to challenge a situation of injustice, oppression, tyranny, or social vulnerability. Political solidarity is fundamentally oppositional: it seeks to abolish an unjust practice or institution. A political solidary is unified not by shared characteristics, as in social and civic solidarity, but rather by a shared commitment to a social justice cause. This commitment entails positive collective moral obligations. The content of these obligations is shaped by the particular cause, but they typically involve some form of social activism. Importantly, the moral obligations entailed by political solidarity, along with the initial commitment that establishes them, are the source of social unity within the solidary. Thus, political solidarity reverses the ordering between social bonds and moral obligations found in civic and social solidarity: in political solidarity, moral obligations precede social bonds.

The core of the book develops Scholz’s theory of political solidarity, beginning with its unique moral content. The personal commitment to act in political solidarity establishes three moral relations: the relationship among the members of a solidary, the relationship between the solidary and its goal, and the relationship between the solidary and the larger society. Each relationship entails specific moral obligations. The relationship among solidary members entails duties of consciousness-raising, cooperation, and mutuality. Consciousness-raising aims to further understanding of injustice and oppression, explore new perspectives that may enhance the movement, and evoke moral emotions, such as anger or hope. It can take a variety of forms, including public debate, support groups, and direct confrontation. The duty of cooperation requires solidary members to reflect on their actions as part of a larger movement and to do their part to further its aim. Members must also coordinate their collective action and work together to ensure that personal relationships within the solidary reflect ideals that are consistent with its cause. Finally, the duty of mutuality requires solidary members to respond to the needs of fellow members appropriately and to communicate fairly and respectfully about how their collective action ought to proceed.

The goal of the solidary movement serves both as a justification for its political activism and as a mediating force within the group. Social criticism is the primary duty entailed by the relationship between the solidary and its goal. Social criticism refers to the moral evaluation of social practices and institutions, such as customs, language, laws, and political institutions, and the values that underlie them. When directed toward society, social criticism enhances understanding of social injustices and holds oppressors accountable, thereby justifying and furthering the solidary cause. Internal social criticism examines the values of the solidary group and ensures its means are morally justified with respect to these values.

The relationship between the solidary and the larger society encompasses several different relations, including the relationship between the solidary and individuals who suffer an injustice but do not join in the movement against it. Social activism is the primary duty of these relations. Activism can take many forms, including boycotts, door to door canvassing, and protests and marches. Activism also has a more personal component: solidary members must examine their daily practices, revising them as necessary to align with the solidary goal.

Some of the most interesting features of Scholz’s theory regard its ontological, social, and epistemological aspects. As we have seen, Scholz defines political solidarity as a unity of individuals who have made a conscious commitment to challenge a situation of injustice, oppression, tyranny, or social vulnerability. In her view, a personal commitment to a social justice cause is the only necessary condition for membership in a solidary; members need not possess some defining characteristic, such as a shared identity or experience of oppression. An important assumption lies behind this view: in political solidarity, the solidary group is distinct from the oppressed group, though there may be significant overlap between the two groups in practice. This view is controversial because it implies that advantaged individuals, including former oppressors and those who have benefited from injustice, can join in solidarity on equal terms with those who have experienced injustice or oppression directly.

While Scholz acknowledges that experiencing an injustice can provide a strong incentive to join in the struggle against it, she offers several reasons for extending solidary membership to advantaged individuals. To name just a few, more inclusive solidaries tend to benefit from a richer diversity of perspectives, may be able to communicate more persuasively with others who do not readily agree with their cause, and often have better access to power structures. Assuming Scholz is correct that inclusive political solidarity is desirable, two further questions arise: How do advantaged members avoid reinscribing their social privilege within the solidary? And how do people who have not experienced injustice or oppression acquire the knowledge they need to participate effectively in a solidarity movement? Scholz draws upon recent work in feminist epistemology and political philosophy to answer these questions. She argues that the initial commitment to solidarity includes two further obligations: a duty to renounce one’s social and epistemological privilege, and a duty to understand the material structure and lived experience of the relevant injustice (or form of oppression, etc.). For advantaged individuals, coming to understand an injustice requires persistently seeking out a variety of perspectives, including those of individuals who have experienced the injustice directly. To do so without repeating the distortion and domination that often characterize communication across difference, advantaged individuals must practice the virtues of openness, attentiveness, empathy, and love.

The book concludes with a discussion of another controversial topic in the literature on solidarity: human solidarity. Contrary to most approaches to solidarity, which posit human solidarity as a distinct form of solidarity, Scholz argues that human solidarity is best understood as a subcategory of social solidarity or civic solidarity. As a form of social solidarity, human solidarity attempts either to describe human unity, typically on the basis of some shared characteristic, or to establish this unity as a normative ideal. In either case, human solidarity entails positive collective moral obligations, such as the duty to respond to the suffering of other human beings. As a form of civic solidarity, human solidarity emphasizes the collective responsibility of the international community to protect the world’s most vulnerable people. Scholz contrasts these forms of human solidarity with international political solidarity, which extends political solidarity beyond national borders. International political solidarity can be conceived as either a personal commitment to ending an injustice that occurs at a distance or spans national borders, or a shared commitment among nations to a social justice cause.

Political Solidarity has many significant merits. By distinguishing among the various forms of solidarity, the book brings conceptual clarity to the literature on solidarity, in which the term “solidarity” is routinely used to refer to a wide range of social and political phenomena, from social justice movements, to national unity, to racial solidarity and solidarity among women. Scholz draws coherently from a number of philosophical traditions, including analytic approaches, existentialism, and feminist philosophy, to construct arguments that are equally accessible to readers of all philosophical orientations. In doing so, she develops a distinctive theory of political solidarity that enhances standard accounts of collective responsibility and offers fresh understandings of familiar political concepts, such as equality, subjectivity, and rationality.

I consider Scholz’s account of political solidarity to be quite plausible, despite the fact that she herself is reluctant to embrace some of its more controversial implications. To draw out these implications, it will be helpful to contrast Scholz’s theory with other prominent accounts. Most theories of political solidarity assume that a shared experience of injustice (or oppression, etc.) defines the solidary, thereby conflating the oppressed group and the solidary group. It follows, on these accounts, that acting in solidarity is a matter of engaging in social activism with similarly situated others to oppose an injustice that affects the solidary group directly. For instance, workers act in solidarity when they conduct a strike to protest unfair labor practices. In contrast to these theories, Scholz argues that a commitment to a social justice cause rather than oppressed group identity determines participation in a solidary, and thus, that the oppressed group and the solidary group are distinct. As I mentioned above, this view implies that individuals who have not experienced a particular injustice can act in solidarity against it. It also implies that the solidary group need not include any oppressed individuals, though it often will in practice. Thus, for instance, consumers act in solidarity with farm workers when they participate in a grape boycott to protest unfair agricultural labor practices, regardless of whether any farm workers join in the boycott.

Scholz’s inclusive account of political solidarity has the virtue of including a wide range of social justice movements under the banner of political solidarity. In particular, groups that oppose injustices occurring at a geographical distance, such as fair trade movements, act in solidarity with those individuals who suffer from these injustices. Similarly, groups that oppose practices that unjustly harm young children or severely cognitively disabled persons act in solidarity with these individuals, even if children and the cognitively disabled are unable to participate in solidarity actions. Scholz acknowledges these cases as strengths of her view. However, she contends that individuals can act in solidarity only with other human beings, not with nonhuman animals or the environment. Political solidarity can be concerned with environmental issues, she argues, but when a solidary group opposes an environmental injustice, it acts in solidarity with the people who are harmed by it, not with those nonhuman animals or parts of the environment that are similarly harmed.

Scholz would be correct to suggest that acting in solidarity with nonhuman animals is impossible on the standard account of political solidarity, since this account requires victims of an injustice to participate in the struggle against it, and animals are incapable of engaging in political activism. However, solidarity with nonhuman animals is possible on Scholz’s account. As we have seen, she suggests that individuals need not have experienced an injustice to act in solidarity against it and the solidary group need not include members of the oppressed group. Given these claims, it seems clear that groups that oppose practices that unjustly harm nonhuman animals, such as factory farming, act in solidarity with animals, even though animals are unable to participate in solidarity actions. Of course, it would be incumbent upon the solidary group to show that the targeted practice constitutes a genuine injustice, a task taken up by many animal rights theorists. However, since Scholz does not raise this issue as an obstacle, I will assume that such efforts could be successful.

Scholz does, however, give two reasons in support of her view that individuals cannot act in solidarity with nonhuman animals. First, she asserts that political solidarity arises in response to human suffering caused by human actions (54). If it were justified, this qualification would rule out solidarity with non human animals. However, simply stipulating that solidarity responds only to human suffering seems arbitrary if we agree that animal suffering is morally relevant, which Scholz clearly does, as she acknowledges that feeling compassion toward animals is sometimes warranted (220). Second, Scholz contends that the obligation of mutuality precludes acting in solidarity with nonhuman animals. In her words, “Mutuality, inherent in the moral relations of solidarity, mandates this requirement. In solidarity, each individual mutually forms a reciprocal relation with the group” (220). Scholz may be correct that nonhuman animals are incapable of the sort of reciprocity required by the duty of mutuality. However, it is important to remember that this obligation applies to the relationship among members of a solidary, not to the relationship between the solidary and the oppressed group. Moreover, if the obligation of mutuality were applied to the relationship between the solidary and the oppressed group, then solidarity with human beings who are incapable of mutuality, including young children and severely cognitively disabled adults, would also be ruled out. Thus, Scholz faces a dilemma: she must either concede that solidarity with nonhuman animals is possible or revise her view so that it excludes solidarity with nonhuman animals, while acknowledging that this move would also rule out solidarity with some of the most vulnerable members of society. I would recommend the former alternative. Granting the possibility of solidarity with nonhuman animals not only would remedy an inconsistency in Scholz’s account, it would also connect her theory with an even broader range of debates, such as those in environmental politics and animal rights, thereby enhancing a significant strength of the book.