Political Theology: Four New Chapters on the Concept of Sovereignty

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Paul W. Kahn, Political Theology: Four New Chapters on the Concept of Sovereignty, Columbia University Press, 2011, 207pp., $32.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231153409.

Reviewed by Lars Vinx, Bilkent University


Paul W. Kahn's Political Theology is best described as a philosophical commentary on Carl Schmitt's famous work of the same title.[1] Like Schmitt's Political Theology, the book is divided into four chapters (plus an introduction and a short conclusion). These chapters bear the same titles as the chapters of Schmitt's Political Theology and attempt to reconstruct the arguments in the original Political Theology.

The aims of Kahn's Political Theology, however, are not primarily exegetical. Though he offers some very illuminating perspectives on Schmitt's text, Kahn is primarily interested in using Schmitt's arguments as a foil to develop a conception of political theology that is applicable to contemporary debates in political and legal theory. This attempt to update the idea of political theology is consistently interesting and intriguing but ultimately fails to convince.

The project of political theology might appear irrelevant to contemporary politics for the simple reason that we are living in a secular state which refuses to give official recognition to any particular religious doctrine. In response to this challenge, Kahn argues that the point of political theology is not to subject politics to the beliefs or demands of some religious tradition or other, but rather to acknowledge that "the state is not the secular arrangement that it purports to be." (p. 18) Even a state that, like the US, sharply separates politics and religion "maintains its own sacred space and history," (p. 19) and political life in the modern state is therefore "not a life stripped of faith and of the experience of the sacred." (p. 18) Political theology, consequently, remains relevant even where there is a clear distinction between church and state.

Like Schmitt, Kahn believes that the existence of a political community depends on a willingness on the part of its members to sacrifice their lives in the defence of the existence of the community against internal or external enemies. The idea of sacrifice, Kahn claims, is implicit in the American understanding of democracy, which grounds the legitimacy of the constitution in a revolutionary exercise of popular sovereignty. A democratic revolution cannot take place without a willingness to sacrifice on the part of a people rising up against its oppressors. Sacrifice, therefore, stands at the beginning of modern political experience and the idea of popular sovereignty is inseparable from it.

The view that one ought to be willing to sacrifice oneself for the state, Kahn argues, is incommensurable to a liberal political theory that bases the state on a social contract designed to further the satisfaction of individual interest. In political sacrifice, the individual willingly subordinates its personal interest to the life of the community, on the basis of the belief that the sacrifice for the state "holds forth an ultimate meaning." (p. 155) A completely de-theologized liberal political theory has no access to that ultimate meaning, and it must consequently fail to offer a complete and adequate understanding of political experience in the modern democratic nation state committed to the principle of popular sovereignty. (p. 17)

Kahn's charge that liberalism must fail to understand the modern experience of the political remains ambiguous. The charge is based on the fact, presumably, that a liberal who denies that 'the state maintains its own sacred space' is likely to see only regrettable slaughter where the political theologian sees a noble sacrifice imbued with transcendent meaning. But to justify a dismissal of liberal political theory one must do more than to point out that a liberal's political experience will differ from that of a committed political theologian. One must show that the liberal perception of the sacrifice as regrettable slaughter is a misperception.

The liberal, the political theologian might argue, wrongly denies that the act of sacrifice for the state is objectively valuable from a moral point of view. But Kahn does not want to make an argument of this sort. He claims that his political theology is "a project of descriptive political analysis." (p. 25) He goes on to point out that one can be engaged in this project without endorsing the "values that are revealed in this account." (p. 26) The goal of political theology, Kahn suggests here, is merely to describe the forms of political experience prevalent in American society. The question is not whether the beliefs and attitudes described by political theology are true or false, but rather how they "figure in the construction of a broader political imagination." (p. 10)

The charge against liberalism, it would seem, must then be a charge against liberalism's capability to offer an accurate descriptive account of political experience, not a charge against the liberal denial of the perceptions of value embedded in that experience. Kahn claims, in this vein, that "we will never find an adequate explanation of the politics of sacrifice in liberal theory or positive political science." (p. 17) So understood, however, the charge against liberalism is either irrelevant or false. If the task of explanation is not to be understood as the task of giving justification or endorsement, but rather as the task of theoretical description, the criticism does not apply to normative liberal political theory, since such theory does not aim to offer explanations. And it is hard to see, on the other hand, why a descriptive social scientist should be unable to offer explanations, be they historical, cultural, social-psychological, etc., for why people are attached to a political-theology of sacrifice, or why he should be unable to understand what it is that those people believe or what their acts of sacrifice mean to them. Of course, the acts in question will not mean to the social scientist what they mean to those who perform them, unless the scientist is himself attached to the political theology that motivates those acts. But if we were to say that the understanding of the non-attached scientist is therefore deficient, we would fall back, it seems, into the view that the scientist's mistake consists in a failure to perceive the sacrificial acts he observes as objectively valuable.

In response to this dilemma, Kahn admits that a popular sovereign acting outside of the law "is no more imaginable from without than is a god to those outside of the faith." (p. 12) But Kahn claims that this is no reason to worry for the political theologian: "Just as no one will be convinced by argument to believe in God, no faith was ever defeated by argument alone." (p. 26) The failure of the liberal political theorist, then, is neither a moral failure nor a failure of description or explanation. The failure, rather, is the liberal theorist's lack of faith in the civil religion that Kahn's political theology is about. The liberal theorist simply does not believe that the sacrifice for the state 'holds forth an ultimate meaning.' One cannot prove by argument, Kahn concedes, that the liberal theorist is wrong not to have faith, since faith is inaccessible to reason. But if a political community is constituted by a shared political faith in the state as a source of ultimate meaning then one can conclude, it would seem, that the liberal cannot be a true member of that political community. Kahn's criticism thus appears to come down to the troubling claim that the liberal is a political heretic, an unbeliever in the American civil religion, and thus an internal enemy.[2]

Understandably, Kahn does not dwell on this implication of his attack on liberal political theory. His rhetorical strategy, rather, is to issue an invitation to join in the faith. Kahn attempts to show that some key features of American constitutional practice, like the institution of judicial review, the veneration of the constitution, or the strong executive power of the president make better sense if they are seen in the light of a political theology. Two key claims emerge in the course of these discussions--claims that are supposed to make attachment to the faith appear attractive, even in the absence of any possibility of reasoned proof of its superiority over a liberal-individualist perspective. Kahn argues that a political religion is needed to avoid inauthenticity and to achieve collective autonomy.

The deepest symptom of liberal inauthenticity, according to Kahn, is the belief that political opponents can always be brought to agreement through reasonable deliberation. Liberals consequently deny that there are states of exception or political crises that are essentially beyond legal regulation and that require a sovereign decision beyond the law. Such a view, Kahn argues, overlooks the possibility of existential crisis: "The mistake is to think that law without sovereignty -- in particular, international law -- has solved the problem of perpetuating its own existence." (p. 56) A state without sovereignty will, in a moment of crisis, fail "to defend its own self-ordering as an existential value." (p. 57) The Schmittian state, by contrast, is mindful of the possible need to defend itself and thus achieves a more authentic form of political existence: "Like Heidegger's authentic individual, Schmitt's state always confronts the possibility of its own death." (p. 60)

It seems to make little sense, however, to argue that liberal states or liberal systems of legal ordering are inauthentic because they fail to solve 'the problem of perpetuating their own existence.' Clearly, a Schmittian state doesn't solve that problem either. Even if citizens share a political religion that motivates them to sacrifice their lives for the state, they may still fail in their struggle to defend their state if faced with a stronger external enemy. What is more, the liberal state is explicitly based on the goal of mutual protection of individual rights and interests. If a state fails to realize this goal, or if it excludes significant proportions of the citizenry from its realization, a liberal would likely argue that the state in question is illegitimate and that its preservation may not be desirable. It is hard to see why such a stance should signal inauthenticity or a failure to confront the possibility of the death of the state. It would be inauthentic, rather, for liberals to attribute unconditional value to the existence of a state that fails to realize liberal aims or even thwarts the realization of those aims.

According to Kahn, however, liberalism is not just guilty of inauthenticity, it also precludes the realization of a form of collective freedom that could not exist without a political faith (see pp. 91-122). Kahn models the free act on the paradigms of aesthetic creation and philosophical dialogue. A genuinely creative act, or a genuine contribution to an ongoing philosophical debate, must be related to the conventions, the language, and the content of previous creative acts or philosophical interventions in order to be understandable to its audience. But it must also distance itself from the earlier conventions, languages, and contents to which it refers and on which it is based in order to create something new. Moreover, the creative act must be surprising in order to be an exercise of freedom. If the act were predictable on sociological, psychological, or ideological grounds, it would fail to qualify as an authentic exercise of freedom. Schmitt's sovereign decision on the exception, in Kahn's view, is the paradigm example of an act that is free in this sense.

As Kahn acknowledges (p. 101), his conception of free decision is in danger of collapsing into mere arbitrariness. To solve this problem Kahn argues, in a rather freewheeling interpretation of the third chapter of Schmitt's Political Theology, that the free act must be based on analogical reasoning (see pp. 101-114). Analogical reasoning bridges the gap between a norm and its application, suspension, or change in a way that goes beyond mere deduction and thus introduces an element of creativity. Since it is impossible to predict what analogies will be drawn and be found convincing in the future, the results of analogical reasoning cannot be predicted by causal analysis. But analogical reasoning nevertheless forges a meaningful relation between antecedent normativity and the free act. It involves seeing a new situation as relevantly similar to past political experience. To participate in a community's political life, one must therefore participate in the practices of analogical reasoning that maintain and develop a community's political self-understanding through history. In doing so, Kahn claims, the members of a political community collectively realize a form of freedom that is akin to the freedom experienced by the aesthetic genius or the great philosopher.

This conception of collective freedom, it would appear, is no more intimately related to a political theology of sacrifice than it is to a liberal narrative focusing on the extension of liberal freedom and equality. Using the method of analogy, one might, following Kahn, interpret contested judicial decisions or uses of extra-legal force on the part of the executive as re-enactments of acts of revolutionary popular sovereignty that transcend legality (see pp. 31-90). But one might just as well use the method of analogical reasoning to show that situations of crisis are relevantly analogous to conditions that have previously been considered amenable to legal control. Hence, the method of analogy as such does not support the idea that every legal order must be based on a sovereign power capable of taking a decision on the exception. Analogical reasoning may, with equal justification, be used to extend the range of legality instead of curtailing it.

Moreover, if the method of Kahn's political theology is simply the method of analogy, it is hard to see what is supposed to be specifically theological about it. Kahn claims that a political-theological inquiry into American political culture will show that "our political life remains deeply embedded in a web of conceptions that are theological in their origin or structure." (p. 120) Even if this were an uncontroversial observation, it would fail to support Kahn's claim that liberal political theory "lacks a conception of the political." (p. 121) If political thought is simply a hermeneutics of social meaning based on analogical reasoning, we will find that the content of 'the political' is culturally variable because different communities understand their politics in different ways. Kahn's general claim that any community which does not subscribe to a political theology of sacrifice doesn't have a true political life is therefore ungrounded.

Kahn complains that liberal theory considers much of American political practice to be pathological, "as if the aim of a political practice is to satisfy some normative theory." (p. 121) But to say that liberal theory ought to be rejected because it considers political practice to be pathological evidently begs the question against a normative theory. Since Kahn fails to establish that political theology is necessary to secure political authenticity or collective freedom, he is in no position to assume that the practices criticized by liberals deserve to be preserved. That he makes that assumption, nevertheless, gives the lie to his initial claim that his project is merely descriptive. At the end of the day, Kahn has little of substance to add to the intolerant and sectarian idea that liberals are un-American since they do not adhere to what he takes to be America's civil religion.

Perhaps this should not occasion surprise. Kahn attempts to distance himself from Schmitt's own views by claiming that his Political Theology differs from Schmitt's in that it "substitutes the popular sovereign for his idea of sovereignty." (p. 9, see also p. 39) But it should be evident to even a casual reader of Schmitt's major works that Schmitt thought his conception of sovereignty was perfectly applicable to the democratic state. Schmitt's project throughout the Weimar-period centers on the attempt to transpose the decisionist idea of sovereignty into a democratic key.[3] It is an unavoidable condition of this transposition, for Schmitt, that we conceive of the principle of democracy as being completely distinct from and as taking priority over the principles of liberal-democratic constitutionalism. Democracy, as a result, comes to be fused with authoritarianism in the call for a plebiscitarian dictatorship that is empowered to act beyond the law. Those who want to employ Schmitt's conception of sovereignty to interpret a constitution which is clearly committed to a separation of powers and to the rule of law must explain why we should accept the authoritarian consequences of Schmitt's conception of sovereignty, or else they must tell us how it is possible to disavow those consequences while using a Schmittian conception of sovereignty. Kahn skirts this issue.[4] One suspects that the political implications of his political theology may not be as different from those of Schmitt's own as Kahn seems to believe.

The problems and gaps in the argument of Political Theology indicate a failure of Kahn's declared project of separating political theology from intolerant sectarian conviction, of making it safe for a society committed to a separation of church and state and to the principles of tolerance and equal concern that underpin it. Kahn's Political Theology may, despite its argumentative failings, have an important lesson to teach, namely that political theology is not a viable paradigm for contemporary political thought.

[1] Carl Schmitt, Political Theology: Four Chapters on the Concept of Sovereignty, trans. by George Schwab, with a foreword by Tracy B. Strong (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 2006).

[2] Of course, a similar assessment will presumably have to apply to those inclined to reject Kahn's sacralization of the state on religious grounds.

[3] See Carl Schmitt, Constitutional Theory, trans. and ed. by Jeffrey Seitzer, with a foreword by Ellen Kennedy (Durham and London: Duke University Press, 2008).

[4] This criticism equally applies to Andreas Kalyvas, Democracy and the Politics of the Extraordinary: Max Weber, Carl Schmitt, and Hannah Arendt (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2008).