Political Utopias: Contemporary Debates

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Michael Weber and Kevin Vallier (eds.), Political Utopias: Contemporary Debates, Oxford University Press, 2017, 260pp., $39.95, 9780190280604.

Reviewed by Patrick Taylor Smith, National University of Singapore


This is a compelling representative of a positive trend in social and political philosophy: the exploration of the space between the extremes of idealism and realism. The idea motivating this collection is that there is more than one way to mix ideal and non-ideal elements in one's political theorizing. Each contributor marks a different point on a continuum, with David Estlund's contribution on prime justice the most idealistic and David Wiens's the most realistic.

Of course, such judgments are made tricky by the fact that what precisely constitutes an idealistic or realistic theory is one of the several claims that are open to contestation from contribution to contribution. For example, one question this collection explores is the relationship between 'fact-dependence' and 'feasibility' when discussing how 'realistic' or non-ideal a theory is. One potential marker of 'realism' is a willingness to take institutions and human nature mostly as they are and to accept constrained possibilities for reform and change. Yet, imagine a theorist who believes that, as an empirical matter, human nature and institutions are fairly plastic, deploys that claim to justify certain principles of justice, but would change those principles if she changed her mind about human nature or society. Should we understand this view as realistic, idealistic, or somewhere in between? And what rides on understanding a view along this continuum? All the chapters in this volume offer, either explicitly or implicitly, different but related ways of answering these questions.

However, the volume does broadly converge on a few claims. First, everyone rejects the extreme idealism of, for example, G.A Cohen, where the content of principles of justice does not depend upon facts about human psychology or how those principles will be realized in anything approaching the real world. This idealism is rejected as otiose, offering little help in terms of guiding our actions or evaluating our institutions. Second, everyone rejects a political realism, such as that associated with Bernard Williams or William Galston, that seems committed to the idea that facts about a particular society determine, or almost determine, the content of the principles of justice. 'Pure' realism is viewed as being insufficiently critical and too biased towards the status quo. As a consequence, everyone in the volume agrees that facts about human nature or about society play some non-determinative role in our normative theorizing. On the other hand, there is very little agreement about which facts are relevant and what role they should play, creating a complex and rich interaction of views. Unlike many other collections generated by conferences, this kind of cohesion creates a surprising amount of cross-cutting argumentation and discussion that rewards reading the entire book rather than cherry-picking a few chapters.

The book has four informal sections. The first consists of just Laura Valentini's chapter, which helpfully surveys different conceptualizations of non-ideal theory. She plausibly concludes that most accounts of non-ideal theorizing should be understood as representing a continuum, setting up the rest of the book as an exploration of the middle ground between entirely non-ideal and entirely ideal theorizing. Her chapter is exceptionally clear and would productively serve as an introductory piece for a graduate seminar or high level undergraduate course. The second section contains essays by David Estlund, Robert B. Talisse, Blain Neufeld, and Pablo Gilabert. These are linked by a broadly pro-ideal theorizing orientation. The third section contains chapters by Alexander Guerrero, David Wiens, and Gerald Gaus and Keith Hankins that defend an orientation closer to the non-ideal end of the spectrum. Finally, the fourth section has two chapters, by Danielle Wenner and Rosa Terlazzo, that possess more of an empirical and applied focus. These last two chapters take up a fairly critical attitude towards ideal theorizing, with Wenner arguing that new results in social psychology undermine the claims of deliberative democrats and Terlazzo arguing that we ought to treat justice for children as a paradigmatic element of our theorizing rather than as a temporary, non-ideal afterthought.

All in all, this book contains an impressively wide range of views while still retaining a set of linked themes. It would be tedious to summarize each individual chapter, and I would almost certainly fail to do justice to their complexities. Instead, in what follows, I will try to pick out some unifying elements, both positive and negative, that cut across several chapters. In the end, I found the book immensely helpful in clarifying my own thinking and found each chapter rewarding, including those where most of my comments are critical.

A common element of several chapters (Neufeld, Talisse, Wiens) is an emphasis on what might be called 'transcendental' arguments. They begin with a feature that is supposed to be a strength of the 'other side.' For the non-ideal-heavy views, this might be action-guidingness, and for ideal-heavy views, this might be critical perspective. Then, they show that this feature of the opposing view depends upon or assumes an orientation further towards the opposite end of the spectrum. So, Talisse argues that action-guidingness -- normally considered a strength of non-ideal or realistic views -- requires ideal theorizing because it is only through idealizing counterfactuals that we can evaluate and justify the relevant 'ought implies can' claims. Any action-guiding view -- including action-guiding realism -- relies upon these claims to argue about what can and cannot be changed about human beings or political institutions. Similarly, Neufeld takes on public reason -- which one could take to be the result of a set of non-ideal circumstances characterized by reasonable disagreement -- and argues that it requires ideal theorizing. This is because the concept of reciprocal acceptability requires that we imagine the consequences of a policy in the context of reasonable compliance, and the demand for the mutual realizability of proposed reforms requires a kind of justificatory holism. This means we will need to imagine how our society operates under full compliance in light of our combined public proposals. On the other side, David Wiens argues that even David Estlund's Prime Justice -- which asks what justice would demand assuming full moral and political compliance -- must necessarily make reference to a comparatively narrow set of facts about human behavior and institutions. The reason is that the nature of compliance and its enforcement -- full compliance could be achieved through effective coercive enforcement or through the internal virtue of one's citizens -- will play a role in determining the content of Prime Justice. None of these arguments purport to show that empirical facts about human nature are irrelevant or that idealizing assumptions play no role in theorizing about justice. Instead, they represent different ways the role of one or the other could be emphasized or reduced.

Some of the authors substantially improve upon discussions of ideal and non-ideal theory in the way that they interrogate and move past the question of whether a set of political principles or reforms is 'feasible.' Along with feasibility, these authors are similarly interested in the applicability of the principle that 'ought implies can.' These two concerns are related in that not all 'cans' and not all feasibility constraints should be treated equally. It seems to matter whether I 'cannot' do something based upon a physical impossibility or psychological phobia or whether I cannot based upon something like inveterate racism or sexism. Similarly, feasibility constraints operate on a continuum, and not all constraints are alike: how sensitive should our theories be to vicious characters or reactionary resistance when considering whether a principle, reform, or institution is feasible? The KKK might make racial equality 'infeasible,' but it is not obvious that we should abandon our ideal, just as it is not obvious that the deeply held racism of the KKK member should inoculate him from his obligation to attempt to achieve the ideal. Pablo Gilabert does an excellent job surveying these issues. He offers a plausible middle path by arguing that feasibility and justice considerations need to operate in conjunction. Sometimes, we have good reasons to emphasize stricter feasibility constraints on our theorizing, and sometimes we have good reasons to engage in normative theorizing that is less fettered by what our world looks today. The appropriate interplay of feasibility and justice cannot be settled a priori.

On the other hand, one of the more impressive features of the realist-oriented contributions is that they do not rely upon simplistic claims about the feasibility of opposing principles or institutions in order to motivate their positions. For example, Gaus and Hankins develop a fairly ingenious argument concerning the deep problems facing ideal theory. First, they argue that our epistemic access to justice in distant possible worlds is limited, so we need to stick to our epistemic 'neighborhood.' Second, the path to the global ideal is not always a Whiggish story of perpetual improvement; there are peaks and valleys as one travels towards the distant ideal. Gilabert and Gaus-Hankins have much to say to each other, with Gilabert arguing for the benefits of political imagination and Gaus-Hankins illustrating the problems and dilemmas faced with reaching too far. Neither article is arguing for one extreme or the other, but the differences in emphasis and perspective are striking. It is a bit of a lost opportunity that they do not directly engage each other, but one can learn a lot by reading them in tandem.

One worry I have about this collection is that, in its desire to create an at least somewhat cohesive set of authors and chapters, it sometimes fails to take seriously alternative substantive views or conceptions of political philosophy. For example, Wenner does a nice job of laying out some empirical challenges to deliberative democracy, demonstrating the ways that social inequalities undermine the benefits of deliberation to both procedure and outputs. Yet, Wenner does not offer an applied or operational account of deliberative democracy that describes what reforms the deliberative ideal would justify in our unjust world. She also does not compare those potential reforms to reforms that would be suggested by other ideals or political principles that might be opposed to deliberative democracy. As a consequence, it is hard to know whether deliberative democracy as a normative ideal is problematic. The question is not whether deliberative democracy can function well in the context of egregious social inequality, but whether understanding deliberative democracy as an ideal can offer us useful ways of conceptualizing and justifying possible reforms in the face of that injustice. It is implausible to think that deliberative democrats are arguing that merely introducing more formal deliberation -- with no consideration for power or resources -- will legitimate democratic outcomes in the face of serious oppression. So, I am not sure that Wenner engages with deliberative democracy on either an ideal level -- showing that there is something wrong with deliberation in a world without social inequality -- or on a more realistic level by showing that the concrete policy recommendations justified by deliberative democracy or advocated by deliberative democrats are mistaken. Thus, while every deliberative democrat needs to understand the empirical work Wenner describes and her worries may ultimately be decisive, I am not yet convinced that we need to jettison deliberative democracy as a regulative ideal.

Guerrero and Estlund both make key assumptions that fail to take seriously other traditions in political philosophy. Generally speaking, the issue is that there is often a richer possibility space than is being considered. Estlund, for example, argues that there is a real philosophical question concerning what the principles of justice should be in a context where everyone complies with both the principles of justice and the requirements of morality. Yet, there seem to be views of justice, perhaps most famously Kant's, that are 'morality invariant.' That is, if there is a significant difference between ethical and political values, one possible view is that the fulfillment of the former is irrelevant to the fulfilment of the latter. And if this view is correct, then there would not be an interesting question of what justice would require if individuals were morally faultless. Of course, perhaps Estlund considers this possibility deeply implausible, but it is striking that it is not even considered.

Similar comments can be made about Guerrero's chapter. When arguing for the claim that no particular set of political institutions are necessary for normative legitimacy, Guerrero assumes what he calls 'institutional functionalism.' That is, political institutions are to be evaluated on how well they protect or further individual interests; there are no intrinsically institutional or political values. Thus, Guerrero can argue that since individual interests can be produced by different sets of institutions under different circumstances, no one institution is likely to be a universal requirement of legitimacy. Yet, if some political institutions are necessary to instantiate distinctly political values, then Guerrero's arguments would be undermined significantly. So, at the very least, Guerrero's argument would depend on some fairly substantive assumptions about which interests political institutions ought to serve. Yet, he does not delineate those interests or present any arguments about which to include or exclude.

For example, Guerrero argues that no one could reasonably accept one's position as a durable loser or minority in a democratic decision-procedure. However, if the procedure itself represented or instantiated a relationship of political equality and that relationship was sufficiently important, then it may very well be reasonable for persons to bind themselves to it even if they usually or always lost the vote. But this view is barely even acknowledged, much less thoroughly considered and discarded. Guerrero does consider the related yet distinct question of whether the fairness of a political procedure might make it reasonable to accept it in the face of being a consistent loser (142-143). He argues that we will need to incorporate facts about a particular society in order to know whether it is the right sort of 'group' such that fairness can legitimate the decision procedure. So, fairness only legitimates in conjunction with facts about the group. Yet, even if we granted that this response could be used mutatis mutandis against the quite different case of irreducibly political values, I would still have a worry. His response only works against the claim that there is some set of political institutions that are sufficient to determine the normative legitimacy of a group. This is because we would need to know additional facts about that society to know whether it was the right sort of group. Yet, if I argued that some political values made a particular set of institutions necessary for the normative legitimacy of all groups that are relevantly political, then I could freely use information about those groups to identify them. Guerrero cannot say that he is only interested in sufficiency claims, because his list of initial questions includes whether any particular right "must be constitutionally protected," (132) he quotes his opponents as arguing that some institutions 'must' be part of a legitimate order (135), and he explicitly commits himself to rejecting the claim that "every legitimate political system must be of Type Y." (134) At any rate, it seems to me that the idea of distinctly or irreducibly political values presents a problem for Guerrero's view. Again, this is not to say that Guerrero is necessarily wrong, but merely that the force of the argument is reduced by his unwillingness to consider alternative positions, including those that have a long pedigree in precisely this dialectical context.

Guerrero's piece reminds us that political philosophy is supposed to, at least sometimes and perhaps indirectly, help us make progress in evaluating and reforming real-world institutions and practices. (128) I believe this collection does this in at least two ways. First, it shows decisively that we can move beyond the tired, black and white conception of ideal and non-ideal theory. Second, the collection illustrates -- with each chapter -- the wide possibility space that is open to political philosophers once this all-or-nothing understanding is rejected. Yet, I am left with a broader worry that we might fall back into the same old bad habits. With the exception of Terlazzo's excellent chapter -- which (despite my quibbles with her reading of Rawls on children) moves effectively from a discussion of ideal and non-ideal theorizing to more substantive claims about how the interests of children should be understood and included in our principles and institutions -- the discussion in this collection occurs at a high level of abstraction. The collection offers little in terms of actual guidance for our first order political principles or institutional recommendations. This is, perhaps, unavoidable in a book trying to carve out new conceptual space, but ultimately these different points along the ideal-realistic continuum will earn their place through the arguments, principles, institutions, and evaluations they make possible or justify. This is doubly true because many of the chapters argue for a contextual understanding of the appropriate mix of ideal and non-ideal theorizing. Yet, how unified or fragmented a theoretical landscape that contextual understanding yields will have to depend on the actual theorizing that is justified or appropriate in the relevant contexts, and there is very little of that work here. So, while this book is very much worth reading and exploring, I am less confident that the second, third, or fourth book that remained at this level of abstraction would help us pass the test that Guerrero has set for us.