Politics and Philosophy in Plato's Menexenus: Education and Rhetoric, Myth and History

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Nickolas Pappas and Mark Zelcer, Politics and Philosophy in Plato's Menexenus: Education and Rhetoric, Myth and History, Routledge, 2015, 236pp., $140.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781844658206.


Reviewed by Ryan K. Balot, Department of Political Science, University of Toronto


The renewal of interest in philosophical esotericism makes Nickolas Pappas and Mark Zelcer's reconsideration of "politics and philosophy" a timely one. Their book offers an extended treatment of Plato's Menexenus, which shows Socrates declaiming a funeral oration to his young friend Menexenus. Socrates does not subject Menexenus to an extended cross-examination or focus on a virtue-term, such as courage or moderation. Instead, after poking fun at Pericles and at Athenian oratory in general, he assumes the role of a democratic orator himself, a move paralleled in Plato's dialogues only roughly and only once, in the Apology. The Menexenus has always provoked controversy among readers. Is Socrates' funeral speech meant simply to ridicule democratic oratory or does it have a serious educational purpose? Or does it accomplish both goals at once? And what does the dialogue say about the proper role of the philosopher in political life?

Building on Charles Kahn's seminal article of 1963, the authors hold that Socrates' speech was intended specifically to improve upon Pericles' funeral oration, as reported in Thucydides'History of the Peloponnesian War.[1] They argue that Socrates' praise functioned as a mode of education for its audience, which was encouraged to live up to the admirable ideals embodied in the fallen soldiers' lives and deaths. By contrast, they contend, Pericles' speech failed to take educational purposes seriously: "Plato certainly perceives Pericles as having ducked pedagogical and acculturative responsibilities" (99). In their reading, Socrates reinterpreted the Athenian myth of autochthony in such a way as to explain, as Pericles and others did not, why the Athenians should continue to protect the other Greeks from Persian aggression. In addition to cultivating civic virtue in his audience, Socrates' speech teaches that history conforms to a recognizable pattern, one that parallels the decline of souls and regimes found in Books VIII and IX of Plato's Republic.

While it is reasonable to approach Socrates' speech as a genuinely protreptic text, the authors do not significantly advance our understanding of the dialogue. Their arguments are convincing to the extent that they remain within well-established frameworks. Otherwise, their views are less plausible and less effectively developed. At best they make a modest contribution to our grasp of philosophy and politics.

A central problem is the authors' disproportionate attention to elementary material. In a brief introduction they explain that since the Menexenus is more closely tied to its historical circumstances than any other dialogue, they plan to use Part I (13-93) to provide a synopsis, to comment on the dialogue's characters and date, to discuss its genre, and to pose challenges to a few previous interpreters. This material -- almost half the book -- is not intended to make a novel contribution. Hence, they warn, "many readers will not need those chapters" (10). Their assessment invites us to wonder about their intended audience, especially since subsequent chapters are intended to engage in conventional scholarly debate. Even in those later chapters, however, readers will be frustrated by the authors' tendency to digress and to treat broad issues at a very high level of generalization (e.g., 150-166).

In Part II, the authors begin by exploring Socrates' transformation of Pericles' funeral oration. The need to compare and contrast these orations is accepted by virtually all readers of theMenexenus. Yet Pappas and Zelcer hardly do justice to the speakers' principal ideas. Their central claim is that Pericles fails to educate the Athenians because he "shrinks from holding up those who died as models for the survivors to emulate" (111). This assertion is difficult to credit. After offering a moving and detailed explanation of the fallen soldiers' virtues, Pericles says, "Try to be like these men, therefore: realize that happiness lies in liberty, and liberty in valour, and do not hold back from the dangers of war" (Thuc. 2.43, tr. Woodruff[2]). While we may legitimately question Pericles' militarism, most readers have understood that his speech is meant as an exhortation to and an education of the living.

In the course of their treatment of the two orations, the authors also reconsider the analytical distinction between ergon (deed, action) and logos (speech) -- another staple of the scholarly literature. Their own interpretation is as follows:

Or to put it the other way, perhaps a cynical way (and quite possibly how Plato would put it), to the degree that Pericles wants to avoid talk of improving democratic supporters, he has to portray Athenians as already fully prepared to act. Their activity is now independent of law and culture and even independent of stirring rhetoric (119).

This characterization neglects Pericles' emphasis on the Athenians' respect for law:

We live together without taking offense on private matters; and as for public affairs, we respect the law greatly and fear to violate it, since we are obedient to those in office at any time, and also to the laws -- especially to those laws that were made to help people who have suffered an injustice, and to the unwritten laws that bring shame on their transgressors by the agreement of all (Thuc. 2.37, tr. Woodruff).

By the same token, it is a real distortion to say that Athenian activity is "independent of . . . rhetoric"; rather, the Athenians' courageous actions depended on a culture of deliberative debate. As Pericles explains, "We are the ones who develop policy, or at least decide what is to be done; for we believe that what spoils action is not speeches, but going into action without first being instructed through speeches" (2.40, tr. Woodruff). While the authors are correct to observe that "understanding the Menexenus requires not knowing how to read Pericles but knowing how Plato would have read him" (101), it is impossible to contrast the two speeches accurately without closely attending to their details. If Plato had ignored these significant elements of Pericles' speech, then his dialogue would be much less successful than it actually is.

When Pappas and Zelcer consider "Myth" and "History" in two final chapters, they make several potentially interesting observations, but they fail to integrate them into a convincing interpretation of the entire dialogue. They argue, for example, that Socrates' use of the autochthony myth self-contradictorily divides humanity first into three groups (Athenians, other Greeks, and non-Greeks) and then into two groups (Greeks and non-Greeks). Only by maintaining this incoherence, they say, can Socrates' speech both defend Athenian superiority and explain Athenian altruism. The point itself is worth noting. Yet the authors refuse to consider that this incoherence may have figured into Plato's literary strategy: "If the myth cannot ultimately deliver this combined implication, it is not for lack of effort on Plato's part. He inherited the story that his speech must tell and there is only so much he can force it to say" (175). The speech's ambiguities, I would say, deserve a better explanation than Plato's limited imagination.

Finally, in their chapter on "History," Pappas and Zelcer connect Socrates' "philosophical history" of Athens to the defective regimes of Plato's Republic. The parallels, however, are vague and inconclusive. This philosophical history is also a "universal history, one with a schema that accounts for the entire known world and illustrates basic principles of motivation and action" (194). This statement is inaccurate. Like all other funeral orations, Socrates' speech is focused on the greatness and benevolence of Athens in particular, not on fundamental principles governing world history.

Overall, the book is both derivative and confused. The authors do not clearly state their central theses or argue for them systematically, and they neglect to consider a number of the dialogue's salient themes. For example, they give scant attention to the personified soldiers' speech, Socrates' most striking innovation. They ignore Socrates' focus on the family or kinship, a significant contrast, as S. Sara Monoson has shown, to Pericles' "erotic" model of citizenship. And, in their eagerness to reject subversive interpretations, Pappas and Zelcer refuse to acknowledge that Socrates' unmistakable humour does not necessarily undercut his speech's critical or protreptic functions. Readers are encouraged to return to the ancient texts themselves and then to consult the most important article-length studies.[3]

[1] Charles H. Kahn, "Plato's Funeral Oration: The Motive of the Menexenus," Classical Philology 58.4 (1963) 220-234.

[2] Paul Woodruff, Thucydides on Justice, Power, and Human Nature (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1993).

[3] In addition to Kahn, I would recommend Stephen Salkever, "Socrates' Aspasian Oration: The Play of Philosophy and Politics in Plato's Menexenus," The American Political Science Review 87.1 (1993) 133-43 and S. Sara Monoson, "Remembering Pericles: The Political and Theoretical Import of Plato's Menexenus," Political Theory 26.4 (1998) 489-513.