Politics and the Passions, 1500-1850

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Victoria Kahn, Neil Saccamano, and Daniela Coli (eds.), Politics and the Passions, 1500-1850, Princeton University Press, 2006, 322pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0691118620.

Reviewed by Catherine Wilson, The Graduate Center, CUNY


This volume contains twelve essays on early modern philosophers from Machiavelli to Mill, addressing their views on the passions from the perspective of intellectual and literary history. Its appearance is timely. Interest in 17th and 18th century theories of the emotions and their implications for social cohesion have been stimulated by recent historiographical studies such as Susan James's Passion and Action (Oxford 2001), as well as by contemporary psychological and philosophical theorizing about the personal and social emotions in Damasio, De Sousa, Griffiths, Prinz, and others. The reader of this collection quickly comes to realize how central to political life the emotions seemed to our predecessors; one of the rewarding aspects of the books is its revelation of this largely forgotten aspect of culture and civilization.

John P. McCormick leads off with a lucid chapter on Machiavelli's discussion of the problem of "tumult" in ancient Rome. He suggests that depending on whom one takes to be the addressee of Machiavelli's writings, he can be considered to be addressing the prince and the nobility (to teach them manipulation); the populace (to teach them to detect manipulation and rebel against it); or the philosopher (to enlighten him as to the workings of his society). Next is an essay by Timothy Hampton on Montaigne's thoughts on the duty to participate in public life, the corrupting influence of ambition, and the ethical requirement of seeking tranquility in private life. One should take on public responsibilities "by way of loan and accidentally… without vexation, without passion." (quote, p. 35). Good luck! one thinks. It is followed by a fine discussion by John Guillory on the ideal of celibacy amongst early modern philosophers, and the formation of the philosopher as a "lay intellectual," whose freedom and ability to pursue humanitarian aims are conceptualized as requiring renunciation of marriage and family -- though indifference to women or homosexuality often lies behind separatist rhetoric, as in Bacon's proposal to unite his philosophical disciple "with the things themselves in a chaste, holy, and legal wedlock" to ensure "an increase beyond all hopes and prayers of ordinary marriage" (p. 68). An excellent survey essay by Daniela Coli summarizes Hobbes's psychological treatment of the human person, bringing out his pacifistic and egalitarian motives. Hobbes, in her view, understood that "the race of life" made men happy and gave their lives meaning but needed stern control if it was not to lead to the anxiety and waste of the internecine warfare Machiavelli took for granted.

Victoria Kahn next explores several curious passages on pity and weeping in Descartes, focusing on his reference to the husband who, in the midst of shedding tears for his dead wife "feels a secret joy in the innermost depths of his soul." Her claim that Descartes in the Passions of the Soul inaugurates "a new regime of politics, one inscribed in the body itself" is not really substantiated by the essay, but her point that Descartes alternates between "an ideal… of wonder at our capacity to act according to free will, and a mechanistic manipulation of the passions" (p. 109) is sound. Judith Butler discusses the drive to live and preserve one's being in Spinoza, noting how Spinoza's apparently egoistic premises are converted into the ethical perspective of the Ethics through generalization about the Other's equivalent ends. (As well as, one might add, the prospective evaporation of the individual into the substance of which it is a mere mode.) She courageously criticizes the conceptions of self-defense and self-determination that appear to underlie contemporary nationalistic policy in Israel at the expense of humanitarian values. Nancy Armstrong and Leonard Tennenhouse propose to challenge the assumption that Enlightenment definitions of reason are to be contrasted with intuition, emotion, and imagination, and they maintain that Locke initiated debate about subjecthood and the emotions. This essay was the one I confess to understanding the least, particularly as it concluded with the claim that "The discovery of the sex drive as the ultimate source -- however diverted and displaced -- of every action revised Locke's empty mind for the age of imperialism… ." (p. 150). Patrick Coleman writes about the emotional structures and social emotions, including gratitude and loyalty, implicit in Rousseau's writings. Coleman thinks Rousseau offered, in Julie, "an imaginative framework in which his readers' inchoate feelings could take articulate form" (p. 168), but that his overall conclusions in Émile were pessimistic; love does not survive confrontation with reality.

Neil Saccamano discusses Hume's response theory in ethics and aesthetics and touches on problems of identity and memory in accounting for spectators' responses, suggesting that "The different hegemonic formation toward which universality moves in Hume is, in my reading, liberalism, in which individuals are no longer positioned solely by birth but by their capacity for economic exchange" (p. 188). Rico Capardi, in an essay nicely complementing the earlier papers on civic emotions discusses the concept of "barbarism" in Vico's semi-mythological anthropology, and its antithesis, "tenderness," noting Vico's insistence that "both democracy and monarchy spring naturally from causes which are quite unheroic" namely love of comfort and affection for one's family (p. 216). Kant's rather atypical for his period view that "the proper way to understand the passions is as a pathology of reason" (p. 229) is examined by Howard Caygill, in an essay that might have been more sharply focused. Caygill believes Kant's concept of self-positing became significant in the post-Kantian rethinking of the passions. I should have thought that advocates of that rethinking were mainly to be found amongst Kant's 18th century opponents and their successors. Finally, Frances Ferguson writes about Bentham's anticlericalism, and his conclusion that homosexuality is socially innocuous, as well as Mill's notion of a "religion of humanity." Her main concern, however, is Stanley Fish and the notion of passionate attachment to belief.

The editors have brought together a coherent and stimulating collection, and the essays by Butler, Coli, Guillory, and McCormick, are especially to be commended, along with the editors' useful introduction. That students of English and Comparative literature have, with this volume, stolen a march on us is a development we largely discipline-bound philosophers must take to heart. Here and there, the philosopher's tolerance for loose reasoning and the historian's for implausibility are tested, but each essay is worthwhile and suggestive in its own way. Politics and the Passions is a well-constructed and coherent volume that opens up new perspectives on the canon of modern, and especially early modern philosophy.