Politics in Socrates' Alcibiades: A Philosophical Account of Plato's Dialogue Alcibiades Major

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Andre Archie, Politics in Socrates' Alcibiades: A Philosophical Account of Plato's Dialogue Alcibiades Major, Springer, 2015, 143pp., $54.99 (pbk), ISBN 9783319152684.

Reviewed by Ioannis D. Evrigenis, Tufts University


Imagine a private conversation between two of the most influential figures of fifth century Athens: the adventurer responsible for the Sicilian Expedition and the city's eventual downfall, and the man who described himself as its gadfly, inspired Plato, and changed the shape of philosophy forever. Such is the plot of Plato's (first) Alcibiades, often referred to as the Alcibiades Major because a second dialogue attributed to Plato in antiquity is named in our lists of Plato's works as Second Alcibiades. Alcibiades is a dialogue between the notorious character after whom it is named and Socrates, set at a time when Alcibiades was still a young man, before his entry into his political and military career, and Socrates, about 17 years older, was already established in the city as a major philosophical practitioner. Although in antiquity the work was uniformly attributed to Plato, over the course of the last century commentators have generally treated it as spurious. In addition to obvious consequences for the work's interpretation, this shift has also resulted in the relative paucity of commentaries. Billed as "the first full, political and philosophically rigorous account" (3) of that work, regardless of its authenticity (7), Politics in Socrates' Alcibiades seeks to show that "Socrates redirects Alcibiades' political ambition . . . by generalizing the notion of argument" (3). A better statement, a little bit later, explains that "the dialogue is best understood when read in light of Socrates' methodological versatility" (8). Archie sees that versatility as a political approach, in this case intended to "change Alcibiades' beliefs and to bridle his arrogance" (9). Although certainly plausible and in line with interpretations that focus on the dialogue's educational aspect, this interpretation of the Alcibiades is also narrow.

The book is divided into five parts largely intended to capture Archie's focus on Socrates' varied methods, although the division between Parts I and II appears to have been drawn at the wrong place. Part I lays out the main argument (Chapter 1) and surveys the basic landscape around the Alcibiades, focusing on the interpretations of Michael Stokes, Ian Kidd, and Jaakko Hintikka (Chapter 2). Although Chapter 3 is a continuation of the work's reception and interpretation, it has been placed in Part II, which purports to deal with the dialogue's treatment of women, a subject confined to Chapter 4. From that point forward, each part consists of a single chapter devoted to a single theme. In accordance with Archie's characterization of Socrates' versatile method as political, Chapter 5 examines "political decisions," namely the options Socrates offers and the decisions that Alcibiades makes in response, seen through the prism of decision theory; Chapter 6 looks at political priorities and their consequences for one's soul; Chapter 7 applies insight from Plutarch's On Listening to the Alcibiades. A very brief conclusion, Chapter 8, suggests certain ways in which the dialogue can educate modern readers. The book has two addenda, a very short one building on a parallel investigation of Plato's Apology and the Alcibiades first raised in Chapter 6 and a longer one on "Socratic traditionalism." Commentaries on dialogues often begin with a tour of the setting, characters, and main signposts of the arguments. Especially in light of the relative obscurity of the Alcibiades, which Archie rightly points to in his introductory remarks, I was surprised not to find background on the Alcibiades that could help situate Archie's arguments better and avoid the occasional repetition of basic information that sometimes made Politics in Socrates' Alcibiades feel more like a collection of articles than a book. It is unfortunate that the proofreading missed many errors.

Archie considers the five themes he chose to focus on essential to an understanding of the dialogue, but he singles out listening as the most important among them. His judgment is reflected in the outcome, for it is his application of Plutarch's insights to the Alcibiades that makes for the most animated and creative part of the book. Unfortunately, as Archie's rather limited conclusion indicates, it is not pursued to its full potential. The dialogue, he argues, illustrates that Alcibiades could have benefited from his encounter with Socrates if only he had "listened appropriately" (9). Thus, the work "intends for us to see that listening can be a source of moral uplift or a source of moral corruption" (9). Alcibiades' last utterance, however, is a promise to Socrates to begin to concern himself with justice immediately (135e4-5). To come to Archie's conclusion, therefore, the reader would have to know how the rest of Alcibiades' life turned out and ascribe its trajectory to Socrates' failure to persuade him. Now, Plato was not averse to foreshadowing future events in his works (e.g., the various references to Nicias' reverence for seers in Laches), and the stature and notoriety of Alcibiades make it highly unlikely that any reader of the Alcibiades would not make the connection immediately. Yet, even those, such as Xenophon (Memorabilia, I.ii.24-28), who concluded that Socrates' alleged corruption of Alcibiades was first and foremost on the Athenians' minds when they charged Socrates with corrupting the youth of the city have tended to point to Alcibiades' character and circumstances as the causes of his downfall. So did Socrates succeed or fail in his attempt to redirect Alcibiades?

Outstanding among his contemporaries for his good looks, lineage, athleticism, and wit, Alcibiades was highly sought after. Most of his admirers eventually gave up their hopeless pursuit of him, but not Socrates. At the beginning of their encounter, both men remark on his persistence and reluctance to make a move, which Socrates attributes to his daimònion. Its objection lifted, Socrates states that he has witnessed suitors who thought highly of themselves fall away one after another because Alcibiades' opinion of himself was far higher: he lacked nothing and needed no one. The moment of their encounter is critical, for Alcibiades is preparing to enter political life. In the words of Jacqueline de Romilly, whose work on Alcibiades is curiously absent from Archie's account, the Alcibiades fills a crucial gap between Alcibiades' youth and later life, equivalent to Prodicus' account of Hercules' choice between aretè and kakìa (Alcibiade, 56). Even though to Socrates Alcibiades professes a fervent preference for justice, his conduct from that point forward makes it clear that he took a rather different path. Like others before him, Archie is certainly right in considering Alcibiades' ambition the cause of his undoing, but there is a danger here of allowing the rest of Alcibiades' story -- the part after his conversation with Socrates -- to divert our attention away from other important political lessons in the Alcibiades.

Socrates' role is to steer Alcibiades towards justice, yet the way in which he goes about it is worth considering. Although eventually Socrates would turn to a customary questioning intended to show Alcibiades that he is not ready to advise the city on matters about which he knows very little, his foray into the conversation is different: he begins by telling Alcibiades that he suspects the young man harbors even greater ambitions than to rise above the rest of Athens on his natural gifts alone (104e4-106a1). This move could well be part of a strategy intended to show Alcibiades that he has not really thought about his plan by putting Athenian politics in proper perspective. If so, however, it is a dangerous move because it introduces the idea that Alcibiades should set his sights much higher. Archie uses the term "provincial" (120) to describe Alcibiades' initial ambition, and that strikes me as exactly right. As Archie points out, Alcibiades is quite "conventional" (79); it is Socrates who seems to have the higher ambition for Alcibiades.

The young man's reaction to Socrates' claim is worth noting: Socrates appears to have made up his mind on the matter, so there is no real point in denying it. If he were right, how could Socrates help him realize it (106a4-8)? Nothing in his response to Socrates' provocation indicates that he denies having harbored such ambition. In addition to not having given much thought to the state of his soul, however, Alcibiades is approaching the administration of the city with the same attitude that the Corinthian envoys would use to describe the Athenian temperament in Thucydides' history: the Athenians, they would argue, are "bold beyond their strength, adventurous above their own reason, and in danger hope still the best" (1.70, Hobbes trans.).

Socrates shows that the same is true of Alcibiades by enlisting a series of tools, as Archie notes. Not least among these is the criticism of Alcibiades' presumptuousness by the wives and mothers of Spartan and Persian kings, Athens' true competitors and thus the true measure of Alcibiades' success or failure. Archie considers these speeches a crucial part of the dialogue, and he is, once again, correct. Here too, however, he does not make as much of them as he could. First and foremost, the dramatic date of the dialogue puts the conversation at the heart of a period during which Sparta and Persia had transformed Athenian politics and would continue to do so for a long time. Together with Athens, these states formed the triangle that defined Alcibiades' dizzying shift of allegiances during the war, perhaps the clearest sign of his hopeless, irreparable character. But their speeches also contain several allusions to the future Alcibiades. For instance, to bring Alcibiades' noble lineage down to its proper rung, Socrates makes much of the measures taken by both Persians and Spartans to ensure the purity of their lines of succession (121b6-d2). The Spartan queen is guarded at public expense, Socrates tells Alcibiades! Well, apparently she was not guarded well enough if we are to believe Plutarch (Alcibiades, 23.7-8), who claims that while hiding in Sparta Alcibiades seduced Timaia, the wife of King Agis and daughter-in-law of Lampido, the very queen who through Socrates takes Alcibiades to task. The child that resulted from that affair would be refused succession, so the Spartan royal line would remain intact, but a vile injustice had been done, and Alcibiades' character had once again been exposed for what it was. Although he treats both the speeches in general and this part in particular (117), Archie does not comment on these allusions to what was to come.

In several of Plato's works, Socrates comments on the inability of parents to teach their sons how to be virtuous, and on more than one occasion he names Pericles as one such parent (Meno, 94a7-b8; Protagoras, 319e2-320b1). In addition to his own sons, Pericles had to oversee the rearing and education of Alcibiades, whom his father entrusted to him as a child, something that Socrates knew well. In light of these facts, it is hard not to see Socrates' criticism of Alcibiades' lack of thoughtfulness, intellectual and moral laziness, and overestimation of his abilities as a critique, also, of Periclean Athens. In that regard, the Alcibiades recalls Menexenus, another work whose relationship to Plato has been the subject of debate, in which Socrates explicitly mocks Pericles' most famous depiction of Athens (in Thucydides' report of his Funeral Oration). The possibility that behind Socrates' scrutiny of Alcibiades lies a critique of the city itself should come as no surprise. Pericles had been responsible for both, and for Socrates the city and the individual are always locked in a mutually formative relationship (Republic VIII). Archie attributes Alcibiades' ultimate failure to a disharmony between his commitment to self-cultivation and his eventual downfall (118-19). I am not sure that covers it. Socrates' parting prophecy to Alcibiades was that the power of the city would overcome them both (135e6-8). What Socrates did not say, but the reader of the Alcibiades knows well anyway, was that it would be for very different reasons. Both men would turn out to be harmonious in their own way: Socrates in his commitment to justice and Alcibiades in his commitment to himself. His promise to let nothing keep him from attending to Socrates and to pursue nothing other than justice turned out to be no more reliable than the rest of his commitments to anyone but himself. It seems that if Socrates succeeded in anything in this encounter, his success was fleeting at best.

Alcibiades' relationship to Pericles, his critical role in the downfall of Athens, and his rare but loaded appearances in Plato's works all call for a return to the Alcibiades. Despite the fact that Archie focuses almost exclusively on politics writ small, his decision to heed that call and consider the dialogue from the perspective of Socrates' versatility is a welcome move and its result a step in the right direction.