Politics of the One: Concepts of the One and the Many in Contemporary Thought

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Artemy Magun (ed.), Politics of the One: Concepts of the One and the Many in Contemporary Thought, Bloomsbury, 2012, 272pp., $32.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441187192.

Reviewed by Hakhamanesh Zangeneh, California State University, Stanislaus


This book opens with a piece by Jean-Luc Nancy, followed by essays from twelve philosophers from Northern and Eastern Europe as well as Russia. The collection has two sources: a multi-year seminar, and a subsequent conference in St. Petersburg. It is thus heteroclitic in both topics and approaches. Some of the essays relate directly to Nancy's work, others center on Badiou, Deleuze, or Heidegger, still others offer independent reflections drawing on a variety of figures from the history of (Western) European philosophy. One essay draws on the Orthodox tradition, and the others reflect on concrete politics (social movements, empire, democratic representation). Most, if not all, are centered on the metaphysics of unity, or 'the One,' in recent post-structuralist political philosophy. At a sociological level, the volume is interesting as a snapshot of political thinking that appropriates and intervenes in debates in Western European texts from the "periphery" (expression used by the editor, p. xx.). This is not to say however, that the volume presents itself directly as a particularly other, Eastern/Nordic, take on Western European philosophy. The relationship between the essays and their foundations is neither one of complete alterity nor one of complete assimilation. One might say that the unity here is 'divisional' (more on that below).

The essays basically all share the project of rethinking unity, or 'the One,' for political thought, but commonalities end there. Many of the essays read like position statements summarizing work in progress, a few seem like arbitrary assemblages of references. The volume works best as a springboard for further research, and Anglophone readers will find both novel avenues to pursue as well as 'thick' metaphysical debates less frequently worked on. The disparities make it difficult to evaluate the book as a whole; below I shall only cover what might be of interest to Anglophone philosophers.

One more cautionary observation before we begin. The volume is published by Bloomsbury, which has taken over Continuum, the house which apparently had contracted the anthology. A number of the pieces unfortunately contain stylistic and grammatical inadequacies in expression. For some essays this is just distracting, but for others it is extremely frustrating. Clearly the publisher's copy-editing was highly inadequate. We can only hope that this will not become a trend with Bloomsbury. More significantly though, we cannot help but wonder whether it really is such a good thing for English to become the de facto lingua franca of European philosophy. This is perhaps unavoidable today -- not long ago, something called the 'European Science Foundation' produced a ranking of philosophy journals, and publication in languages other than English was initially used to relegate journals to the 'B' or 'C' category. Now, if Anglophone philosophy puts a premium on 'clarity,' as defined by composition models taught in Anglophone universities and less elsewhere, then the obligation to write in English seems to unavoidably place international colleagues in a bad light. In this reviewer's experience, the profession suffers from a pressing need to address this issue.

The essay by Jean-Luc Nancy ("More than One," almost identical to his first chapter in Dans quels mondes vivons nous?, co-authored with A. Barrau, 2011) sketches a new conception of the One for a contemporary political context. That context, analyzed at greater length elsewhere, is 'globalization.' Nancy does this here by contrasting two types of unity, "two logics of the One," (p.7). The first figure is that of a unity produced by arithmetical fusion, or accumulation, of pre-existing units. This unity is in opposition to multiplicity, which it aims to overcome. Nancy identifies this unity with both capitalism and technicity. The other form of unity is beyond the opposition singular/multiple. It is not a homogeneous unity, nor is it composed of pre-individuated units. For those familiar with the history of Ancient henology, this seemingly obtuse construction has numerous, highly elaborate precursors in post-Plotinian thought. (While none of the essays in the volume delve into this issue, it could have been very helpful to elaborate on this conception via readings of Proclus, Damascius, etc.) Now, these two logics of the One are not exterior to each other, but are, we might say, two interpretations of the same state of affairs. Nancy appropriates the Heideggerian interpretation of the history of being, insisting on the continuity between physis and techne, and leading horizontally to nihilism. The two logics of unity are thus two ways of construing the movement that he wants to find pervading both nature and technicity. What is clear is that the second form of the One is determined by division. Here, the process of division is what engenders unity and transforms the oneness of the divided, whose unity does not precede but follows from the division. This division then has its own peculiar spatiality (the space of being-together, Mitsein), and its own rhythm. This rhythmic profusion and proliferation, running through nature and technicity, must not, Nancy claims, be thought through accumulation and the first logic of the One. All this suggests that the One he is interested in is less a unity than plural singularity. This relatively easy essay would serve well as a compact introduction to Nancy's general project.

In the first of two essays, Gerald Raunig attempts to elaborate on the logic of division. After quickly contextualizing division within the horizon of recent thinkers of community (Agamben, Blanchot, Nancy) he turns to Gilbert of Poitiers to extract a concept of the 'dividuum.' Gilbert distinguishes the dividuum from notions of the singular, the person and the individual. These notions are characterized by exclusion of conformity, disconnection, and wholeness. The dividuum by contrast, is not individual, thus neither dissimilar nor whole. It is separated and thus divided, divisional, it is thus similar and one among others. The dividuum is also "con-form", in that it shares form with others. All this of course sketches out a novel metaphysical language, and we can only hope that the author elaborates on this intriguing conception in future works. At this stage however, it is hard to see how even this approach can avoid conceptions of essence and of sharing. In his second piece Raunig, instead of fleshing-out the dividuum conceptually, uses the notion to interpret various recent social movements in which he sees instantiations of that metaphysical structure.

In his first essay, the editor Artemy Magun suggests thinking of the one through a long list of references to the notion of solitude. The longest analysis is dedicated to Lars von Trier's film Melancholia. Solitude as mood, like melancholia, shows aspects of disjunction and plurality, and, Magun claims, collectivity insofar as the mood refigures the disclosed world. He also proposes a bridge from Hegel to Frege and to Badiou, contrasting notions of one and zero, parallel to unity in solitude versus nihilism. Some of these associations are novel and suggestive, but the concept of unity that emerges here is essentially a plurality disclosed by an individual experience.

The piece by Boyan Manchev is refreshingly free of quotes and references. His proposed scheme consists in opposing being to becoming and identifying that with an opposition between the One and the world. After a critique of the hypostatic one-being he opens an affirmative discourse on the world as becoming. In an echo of Nancy, Manchev contrasts globalization's homogenization with a pluralizing transformation rejecting production-consumption. His project calls for a 'transformation of the transformation' (of globalization). What is refreshing here is the refusal to oppose uniformity to a messianical event. But it is not at all clear how his 'polemical becoming multiple' produces collectivity. Do we not already live as "singularities in tension with other singularities?"

Michael Marder's essay is a well-developed episode from his project of plant-philosophy. Here, he exploits political connotations in the language used to describe vegetation in the history of the philosophy of nature, from Aristotle to Canguilhem and Deleuze. The plant, he claims, defies the 'logic of identity' and so its various modalities of growing intrinsically have plurality. The resulting political configuration in this account is a highly pluralistic, even anarchic democracy. Again, we are presented with an elaborate and novel metaphysical language, aiming to reconfigure the political completely. What is not clear is how the vegetal can ever be more than an analogy, a model, an allegory of the political.

Susanna Lindberg's contribution is really a précis of a larger project. She engages the notion of unity via a concept of the common, which she proposes to identify with the 'elemental,' understood with echoes both of the material world, the Earth, and of Ancient physics. She describes the elemental also as the reverse side of the world, as its ungrounded ground. Thus in the epoch of a loss of the unifying sense of the world, she proposes a turn to the elemental as a generative background. While the elemental is a common ground, it does not have the level of stability of a One. It is not a graspable thetic object, but disclosed affectively. While this line of thought will be reminiscent of non-discursive traditions of Neoplatonism, Lindberg names the elemental 'techno-science,' in an echo of Nancy's work.

In the most directly historical essay of the volume (also the most detailed in interpretation and argumentation), Jussi Backman turns to Heidegger's reading of Parmenides to think unity. This essay does not thematize the One in opposition to another concept, nor does it propose any novel form of unity. Rather, it attempts to read a historicity into the Parmenidean One with Heidegger's concepts of Anfang and Entscheidung. The One, here, is figured as presence and the 'proto-metaphysical' crisis is the separation of presence from its opposite. The post-metaphysical crisis on the other hand is the affirmation that presence, thus unity, cannot be divorced from its opposite, cannot be intelligible without being thought together with a differentiation from non-presence. This is a generally familiar Heideggerian move, but despite the closely argued detail, the essay makes very quick transition from the One to 'presence' and the latter term becomes highly ambiguous.

Three of the essays (by Keti Chukhrov, Vitaly Kosykhin and the late Alexey Chernyakov) take the work of Badiou as their point of departure -- one centering on the debate with Deleuze, one on a comparison with Heidegger, and one giving an 'objectivist' reading of Badiou. Unlike the vast majority of Anglophone writing on Badiou, these essays do not foreground his relation to politics (or to psychoanalysis) but instead debate his metaphysics of the one/multiple. Unfortunately they do not engage with Badiou's relation to mathematics at any length. Nonetheless, readers interested in the Badiou/Deleuze debate (about events and the one/many) might find some suggestive associations -- the pieces by Chukhrov and Kosykhin are shot through with a litany of references to authors both classical and obscure. The piece by Chernyakov, though not particularly incisive, is still quite pedagogically illuminating since he does not write from the polemical vantage point of anti-Heideggerianism typical of Anglophone Badiou experts.

Of all the essays, the one by Oleg Kharkhordin covers ground which is likely to be most unfamiliar to Anglophone philosophers. The author attempts to draw on the aesthetics of the icon, in the Byzantine tradition, to propose a theory of political representation. The conceit is of course that, within that tradition, icons are not thought of as mimetic. While referring to historical authors, Kharkhordin also accords privileged position to the recent icon-theory of the French philosopher Marie-Jose Mondzain. The result is a notion of a political leader who does not represent but 'stands in front of' a group, which for its part is in retreat. This is an intriguing configuration, though its heroism seems at odds with the idea of participation.

The volume also contains an essay by Marcia Schuback on fragility and otherness, a piece on aleatory political representation by Yves Sintomer, and a second piece by the editor on the history of the concept of empire, offering a reading that diverges from the Negri/Hardt conception. As this review makes clear, the volume is composed of a very wide variety of approaches and authors. Obviously each author makes a contribution to a thinking of a unity that is derived from, but does not overcome division. However, their respective frameworks are so heterogeneous that, at least for this reviewer, it is hard to see the requisite convergences that would constitute the advancement of a research project. Perhaps, the authors may be content with having put together a work whose only unity is based on division and disparateness. Overall, the better essays here are thought-provoking and suggestive, but again, a bit too divisional. Much as is the case with the politics of unities begotten by differences, the real instantiation here leaves the reader with very little concrete unity at all.