Popper, Objectivity and the Growth of Knowledge

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John H. Sceski, Popper, Objectivity and the Growth of Knowledge, Continuum, 2007, 159pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826489043.

Reviewed by Peter Slezak, University of New South Wales


Sceski's book provides an answer to Godfrey-Smith's (2007) recent question: "Is Popper's philosophy alive or dead?" Sceski says "I assert that Popper's philosophy provides the best framework to answer all questions concerning objectivity: epistemological, metaphysical, political, linguistic, and ethical." (p. xi) Sceski's aim is partly "to argue that Popper's philosophy merits a more extensive place in contemporary philosophical discourse than it has generally received." (p. xii)

Although the book's brevity is a virtue (around 130 pages of text), Popper's relevance is harder to establish than in a larger work such as Keuth's (2005). For example, Sceski does not place Popper fully into the rich philosophical context and tradition in which his work arises. To mention an important example to be discussed presently, the differences between Popper and Kuhn are surely relevant to assessing whether Popper still provides the best answers to the questions Sceski cites. Moreover, his technical discussions are not as helpful for the uninitiated as they might have been in a longer treatment. Nevertheless, Sceski covers the wide range of Popper's ideas that undoubtedly deserve serious ongoing attention. Not least, Popper's idea that critical rationalism has relevance to politics as well as science has not lost its importance. Other central topics discussed include Popper's view of probabilities as propensities, his Three Worlds doctrine, verisimilitude, evolutionary epistemology and ethics.

Although it is perhaps an overstatement, Sceski (p. 8) says "Popper is the first to see things rightly" in recognizing that the goal of science is not to justify our theories as true but rather to make fallible claims objective and, thereby, to have "an irrational faith in reason" (p. 9). Perhaps Hume could be credited with the same insight. Nevertheless, Sceski (p. 7) notes that Popper's philosophy of science is revolutionary because it leads us to view knowledge as "everything epistemologists say it should not be" -- in Miller's (1994) bon mot: "unjustified, untrue, unbelief".

Sceski (p. 14) notes Popper's central demand that theories not be self-contradictory on the grounds that "a self-contradictory system is uninformative … consistency is the most general requirement for a system … if it is to be of any use at all." However, one is reminded of Russell's (1946, p. 637) remark on Locke:

No one has yet succeeded in inventing a philosophy at once credible and self-consistent. Locke aimed at credibility, and achieved it at the expense of consistency. Most of the great philosophers have done the opposite. A philosophy which is not self-consistent cannot be wholly true, but a philosophy which is self-consistent can very well be wholly false. The most fruitful philosophies have contained glaring inconsistencies, but for that very reason have been partially true.

Russell's point is perhaps equally pertinent to the most fruitful scientific theories where the logician's ideals are less important than the vagaries of intellectual creativity and explanatory fecundity.

In other respects also, as Kuhn argued, Popper's logical ideals may be seen as too unrealistic to account for actual scientific practice. Sceski does not explore the important differences with Kuhn on the crucial Popperian doctrine of falsifiability. However, when the practice and psychology of scientific research are taken seriously as opposed to the logic of discovery, Kuhn (1970, p. 6) noted that we must "turn Sir Karl's view on its head" since "it is precisely the abandonment of critical discourse that marks the transition to science". Relatedly, there is no index entry in Sceski's book to the holism of Duhem and Quine that counts against Popper's falsifiability doctrine. Sceski's passing mention of "truth holism" (p. 42, 43) is unclear at best.

Sceski (p. 61) rejects the view of Keuth (2005, p. 125) that "Popper did not solve the problem [of induction]; rather he shifted it." Sceski suggests that Popper "uncovered the true character of universal scientific claims as conjectural." Sceski (p. 39, 60) says that Popper's account of scientific method may be summed up in the idea of science as "a system of controlled guesswork," meaning, of course, his famous conception of "conjectures and refutations." However, in light of the rich technical developments since his writing about this "guesswork", it is clear that there is much more to say about "the true character of universal scientific claims as conjectural." Symptomatic of what is missing from Sceski's treatment is consideration of pertinent work in the tradition of Induction by Holland, Holyoak, Nisbett and Thagard (1986) that incorporates psychology, artificial intelligence and philosophy.

As far as Popper's continuing relevance on this issue is concerned, it is worth noting his explicit concern in The Logic of Scientific Discovery (1959, p. 31) to distinguish the "psychology of knowledge" or the genesis of an idea, from the "logic of knowledge." Popper argues, "The initial stage, the act of conceiving or inventing a theory, seems to me neither to call for logical analysis nor to be susceptible of it." Perhaps because he shares Popper's view, Sceski neglects important developments in this area that bear on his concern to rehabilitate Popper. The celebrated work of Herbert A. Simon (1966) and others (Langley 1987, Thagard 1992, Nersessian 2008) has shown that something like a logical analysis of creative scientific discovery is indeed possible along the lines of Pierce's abduction. In his early paper 'Scientific Discovery and the Psychology of Problem Solving', Simon (1966) cites Kuhn (1962) and Hanson (1958) as having anticipated his approach to the modelling of scientific creativity. Sceski discusses Popper's (1959, p. 53) analogy between methodological rules in science and the rules of chess but misses the irony and significance of this very example. Popper takes the rules of chess to be analogous to the methodological "rules of the game of science -- that is, of scientific discovery". But it was precisely for the game of chess that Newell and Simon (1972) developed their theory of "heuristic problem solving" that was adapted to models of scientific discovery (Langley 1987). Sceski (p. 135) notes Popper's explanation of "how the transition from one epoch to another takes place in a rational manner", namely, "via a tradition of critical inquiry". But this is an almost empty formula and provides little to compare with the detailed cognitive, intellectual mechanisms for "conceptual revolutions" proposed by theorists such as Thagard (1992) and Nersessian (2008) who propose model-based reasoning involving activities such as creating analogies, deploying visual representations, and performing thought experiments.

Besides the problem of induction, the second fundamental problem in the theory of knowledge for Popper is the problem of demarcation. Here too, Sceski's treatment of this question does not indicate that Popper's views may be seen as dated and superseded. For example, Laudan (1983) sees the entire question of demarcating science from non-science lapsing in favour of adjudicating the intellectual, explanatory merits of theories and their warrant.

Despite occasional dissent from Popper's views (p. 121), Sceski's discussion remains uncritical on central issues. For example, Popper's views on language and its evolution are exceedingly naïve by contemporary standards. Despite the controversial nature of Chomsky's claims about language and its uniqueness (Hauser, Chomsky & Fitch 2002; Fitch, Hauser & Chomsky 2005), Popper's idea that human language emerged from "animal language" cannot be uncritically asserted as if there is no serious alternative. Moreover, in light of the contemporary engagement of philosophers with cognitive science and linguistics, while there are some who are guilty, there is no justification for Sceski's (p. 111) unsupported generalization that "philosophers have mostly addressed the problem of language independent of what science can tell us" (see Collins 2008, Devitt 2006, Jutronic 2006, Ludlow 1997).

Sceski critically discusses Popper's attempt to combat subjectivism and his arguments for World Three objects as arising from language. Sceski (p. 121) characterizes Popper's view here as "woefully inadequate and ignorant of developments in the philosophy of language", referring to the later Wittgenstein and to Quine's rejection of meaning that he takes to be "an important foil to Popper's World Three ontology" (p. 121). Quine's doctrine is perhaps not the last word on these matters, but in any case Popper's illustration of the natural numbers suggests that his view is defensible in the same ways that the status of mathematical objects may be warranted. In particular, intuitionist or conceptualist views have an analog in Chomsky's (1982, p. 16) view of grammars construed as representing tacit knowledge of conceptual structures. This is essentially the intuitionist according to which mathematical formalisms have no independent existence apart from the constructions of the mind (see Gil 1983, Pylyshyn 1973, and Parsons 1995). These accounts bear on Popper's conception of World One objects such as a book of logarithm tables and other such ink marks. Sceski (p. 119) reports Popper's view that "All such products can be studied objectively, that is we can study them not in terms of the subjective thought processes that underlie their production, but instead as products developed in response to a particular problem situation." However, this conception of objective "products" is found also in recent nominalist views of linguistic tokens (Devitt 2006) but subject to severe, well-known criticisms (see Slezak 2009). Thus, Bromberger (1989, p. 59) notes that linguists "habitually conflate mention of tokens with mention of types" but "tokens are not what linguistics is primarily concerned with. Types are." Bromberger concludes "linguistics is not just about types and tokens but is also inescapably about minds", just as we might also conclude about Popper's World One objects.

As Sceski notes (pp. 8, 42, 83), the historicist tendencies that Popper excoriated have an analog today in Bloor's (1976) "strong program in the sociology of knowledge". Sceski says "With some charity, we can say that this approach is praiseworthy to the extent it is motivated by the recognition of the fallibility of our truth claims" (p. 43). Popper wouldn't have been so charitable. These doctrines are essentially the ones Popper characterised as the "revolt against reason" -- a rejection of ideals of truth and rationality which, however difficult to explicate, are nonetheless central to the Western scientific, intellectual heritage. Popper saw the same tendencies in Hegel which he bitterly denounced as "this despicable perversion of everything that is decent". Pretty strong stuff, but there can be little doubt about the close affinities between Hegel's doctrines and what Gross and Levitt (1994) refer to as the "grotesqueries" and "intellectual dereliction" of modern academic life in Bloor's sociology of knowledge. For the varieties of social constructivism, just as for Hegel, truth is determined by historically particular social milieux. Popper says that with the advent of these doctrines "freedom of thought and the claims of science to set its own standards, give way, finally, to their opposites". Popper's discussion of Hegel's specific doctrines as well as his "bombastic and mystifying cant" is striking in its parallels with the scathing critiques of the sociology of knowledge by Laudan (1990) and others (Slezak 1994a, b).

Popper's analysis and condemnation go well beyond Sceski's diagnosis of the sociology of knowledge as founded on the thesis that conceivability entails possibility (pp. 42-3), citing the somewhat tenuous connection with Gendler and Hawthorne (2002). Equally doubtful is Sceski's suggestion (p. 84) that "a coherent account of verisimilitude might do much to dissuade those thinkers who are trying to dissuade culture in general concerning the objectivity of science." On Popper's view, the problem posed by such tendencies is rather more serious. Like Laudan (1990, p. x) who sees a "rampant relativism" as "the most prominent and pernicious manifestation of anti-intellectualism in our time," Popper (1966, p. 395) warns against the "magic of high-sounding words" and the "power of jargon" to be found in doctrines which are

full of logical mistakes and of tricks, presented with pretentious impressiveness. This undermined and eventually lowered the traditional standards of intellectual responsibility and honesty. It also contributed to the rise of totalitarian philosophizing and, even more serious, to the lack of any determined intellectual resistance to it.


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