Post-Continental Philosophy: An Outline

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John Mullarkey, Post-Continental Philosophy: An Outline, Continuum, 2006, 260pp., $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826464610.

Reviewed by Alistair Welchman, University of Texas at San Antonio


This book has two aims. First, it provides readings of four French philosophers more or less outside of the main phenomenological stream of French ('continental') thought exemplified by Derrida. The philosophers are Gilles Deleuze, Michel Henry, Alain Badiou and François Laruelle. Collectively they constitute the beginning of what Mullarkey takes to be the post-continental philosophy of his book's title. Mullarkey considers these thinkers to be united by a commitment to the idea of immanence. But he argues that each of these philosophers tacitly betrays the immanence they are officially committed to. And this leads to the second aim of the book: an original philosophy of immanence that avoids the pitfalls identified in the rest of book. Here Mullarkey's central term is ‘diagram’, a word that he intends literally (among other ways).

The term 'immanent' is a slippery one, as Mullarkey himself acknowledges (7). But its basic sense emerges quickly from his analysis of Deleuze, an analysis that plays a coordinating role in relation to Badiou and Henry. According to Mullarkey, Deleuze's claim to be a philosopher of immanence is vitiated by his commitment to a 'two-world ontology' (25) spanning both the virtual and the actual. Although Deleuze himself is at pains to distinguish the virtual from the possible, this nicety does not concern Mullarkey because for him any ontological category going beyond what actually exists (the actual) is ipso facto transcendent and therefore no longer immanent.

On Mullarkey's reading, Henry and Badiou recognize that immanence cannot brook two worlds and each takes one 'world' of Deleuze's and tries to construct a consistent philosophy of immanence out of it. Thus, Henry's phenomenology of Life affecting itself takes up the qualitative aspect of things that Deleuze described as actual; whereas Badiou's mathematisation of ontology into set theory takes up the intensive quantities that Deleuze had assigned to the virtual.

In a nutshell, Henry and Badiou founder precisely because their monistic (but one-sided) ontologies fail to account for other phenomena: Henry's resolutely pre-reflective self-affection can perhaps distinguish itself from the objective world of reflective consciousness, but cannot account for it; similarly, Badiou's abstract ontology of sets can distinguish itself from the evental subjective dimension of truth, but cannot show how the latter arises. In a gesture whose Kantianism unfortunately remains largely unexplored, Mullarkey assigns Henry and Badiou respectively to percept and concept (176) suggesting that the two need each other as Mullarkey's Deleuze had already claimed. Mullarkey's reasoning here is interesting. He says that philosophies of immanence lack an 'error theory' (38 on Deleuze, 69 on Henry, 111 on Badiou). By this he means that these philosophies of immanence cannot account for why things are -- or even appear to be -- non-immanent. Deleuze of course does have an answer to this question, since (on Mullarkey's reading) he does have a dichotomous position; but then he is no longer thinking immanence.

This places the philosophy of immanence in an awkward position, according to Mullarkey: it must eschew evaluation, since evaluation promotes one thing over another, which would introduce a bifurcation into immanence. Of course the two issues are related: it hardly took Nietzsche to point out that Plato's original bifurcated 'two-world' ontology already presupposes an evaluative hierarchy between reality and appearance. But the upshot is that a philosophy of immanence must be scrupulously descriptive, 'neutral' and 'value-free' in nature (23).

The idea of immanence leads Mullarkey to identify a third problem. If everything is immanence, then a philosophy of immanence must also itself 'be' immanence. Do the philosophers of immanence in fact respect this requirement? Not really: to say that Deleuze's philosophy is itself rhizomatic fails to differentiate it from anything else, since everything is supposed to be rhizomatic. Henry's auto-affection operates explicitly below the level of reflective consciousness (which can only misrepresent it). But Henry's saying of this in his philosophy is a reflective consciousness that must at the same time be affect affecting itself. Prima facie it is hard to see how Henry can achieve this without bifurcating the immanent ontological monism of affect. With more subtlety, Badiou gives philosophy a limited role in the compossibilizing of truths constituted extrinsically in other domains, but not of stating its own truths. But Badiou's own philosophy implicitly positions itself above and outside mathematics in the very gesture by means of which it claims that it is true that ontology is set theory.

Mullarkey's reading of the fourth thinker of immanence, Laruelle, is different from that of the others and markedly more sympathetic. Laruelle's own position is insistently 'non-philosophical' in the peculiar sense that he attaches to this term. His strategy has been to map out a structural matrix for possible philosophical positions and exhaustively show how the very constitution of the philosophical enterprise dooms it to failure. A philosophical position is the result of a decision by means of which its entire structure is constructed all at once. An epistemological philosophy for instance posits the Real as the known, but at the same time necessarily requires a subjective element (the knower) and a connecting term (knowledge) that is both presupposed by the other terms and makes them possible. The terms of a philosophy do not form an argumentative chain, but rather occur all at once in a self-supporting circle. Laruelle claims that this circularity cannot be overcome within philosophy, but only in a 'non-philosophy' that traces out the moves of a philosophy while putting the philosophy itself in brackets.

Nevertheless, the obvious philosophical response to non-philosophy is to view it as a kind of meta-philosophy, and this is what Mullarkey does in his final chapter. This chapter can also be regarded as taking a French philosopher for its theme, this time Derrida. Mullarkey views Derrida as the philosopher of the irremediably transcendent who tries to show that every attempt at immanence, e.g. at unbroken presence, is necessarily a failure, always broken by transcendence (e.g. by an absence). If Derrida were right then of course a philosophy of immanence would be impossible. But this is not Mullarkey's view, and this chapter tries to recover Laruelle's non-philosophy for philosophy as immanent meta-philosophy.  To do so, Mullarkey introduces his term of art, the diagram.

How is the diagram immanent meta-philosophy? The best way to address this question is a little obliquely, by considering the issue of self-relation. This underlies a number of thorny and long-lived philosophical problems. It is the apparent ability of a set to relate to itself by containing itself as a member that leads to Russell's Paradox: does the set of sets that do not contain themselves as members contain itself as a member or not? If it does not, it must; and if it does, it must not. Russell's paradox harks obviously back to the Cretan Liar Paradox, which rests (in its most elegant form: 'This statement is false') on the ability of a sentence to relate to itself by taking itself as its own topic. But, differently inflected, self-relation also relates itself to infinite regress: in the specular economy of classical German philosophy, an object requires a subject and the subject is also capable of relating to itself by taking itself as an object. But in so doing it does not grasp itself as subject but as object, and thereby requires the thought of another subject that is the one that is taking it as an object. This subject can be grasped, but only at the price of an evident regress in the direction of yet another subject.

These ideas are clearly crucial to the thinkers Mullarkey is writing about. Badiou constructs his equation of ontology with mathematics precisely on the modifications set theory underwent in order to exclude Russell's Paradox. His distinction between an ontological multiplicity and an evental situation lies precisely between a configuration of sets obeying the axiom that no set may be a member of itself and a configuration that violates that axiom, creating paradox, but also thereby novelty. Henry's central concern with affect affecting itself can be seen as an attempt to stop the infinite regress of specular subjectivity at a non- or pre-reflective self-relation of affect. For Laruelle, philosophy always engenders a specular regress, not as the result of a metaphysics of subjective representation in particular, but quite generally because philosophy always relates to itself as meta-philosophy. A philosophy must find some way to position itself within its own scope, and, uniquely among disciplines, it can only do so from the inside: the philosophy of physics is not physics, but the philosophy of philosophy is philosophy, meta-philosophy. Non-philosophy takes philosophy as its object (better: material) and therefore puts a stop to the specular regress of meta-philosophy in a way that is analogous to the way Henry's conception of non-reflective self-affecting life puts a stop to the specular regress of representational thought.

Self-relation is the demon haunting immanence and Mullarkey must exorcise it to clear the way for a philosophy of immanence. Specular self-relation opens up a fissure of transcendence in immanence that separates it from itself originally. This demon achieves its most tangible presence in the philosophy of Derrida, and Mullarkey's account of specular self-relation stands as an insightful diagnosis of Derrida's problematic. Mullarkey however is not primarily interested in this diagnosis, but in resisting Derrida's conclusion: a philosophy of immanence is impossible because transcendence is always already inscribed within it. It is this bifurcation that lies at the bottom of the conceptual problems Mullarkey detects in his erstwhile philosophers of immanence.

How does his conception (or better: practice) of the diagram make it possible to escape the clutches of Derrida's all-embracing transcendental argumentation? Laruelle's solution to the problem of philosophy necessarily referring to itself in a meta-philosophy is to practice a non-philosophy that, strictly speaking, advances no philosophical claims at all (136). There is no paradox of self-reference because non-philosophy says nothing at all about philosophy. Of course the obvious price to pay here is what seems like a clear (non)-relation of externality and transcendence between non-philosophy and philosophy. Laruelle would deny this, but let us follow Mullarkey's line of thought, which uses Laruelle, but to construct a philosophy of immanence rather than a non-philosophy risking transcendence. The diagram answers this need because, based in spatial figures rather than linguistic utterances, a philosophical diagram also says (literally) nothing about what it diagrams, and as a result it can constitute an immanent philosophy able to relate to itself without referring to itself. The diagram is philosophy's non-thetic self-consciousness; or, more in Mullarkey's Wittgensteinian register: the diagram says nothing, but still nevertheless shows something (190).

The one thinker I omitted in this reconstruction of the importance of self-relation in Mullarkey's book is Deleuze. Does Deleuze fit into Mullarkey's matrix of self-relation in any significant way? In fact he does, but Mullarkey does not emphasize this aspect of Deleuze, and it is instructive to consider why. Deleuze thinks about self-relation through the concept of an assemblage (or desiring-machine), i.e. the minimal unit of a material system capable of modifying itself. By materializing self-relation, its representationally paradoxical properties are neutralized. The logical contradiction of the Liar Paradox resolves itself into the engineering circuit of the bistable multivibrator: 'This statement is false' is true when it is false and vice versa; but a logical NOT gate whose input is connected to its own output materializes the unthinkable by traversing a sequence of states in time: TRUE, FALSE, TRUE etc. Mullarkey mentions the idea that the materialization of paradox and regress (e.g. in his diagram) deprives them of their force as objections (e.g. 98, 154f, 161, 185); but he attributes the idea to Henry (58).

This is a telling move because Henry's thought of matter, although radicalized, is plainly phenomenological in its basic orientation. Henry rejects the 'hyletic' conception of matter as the mere content of representational form (56). But his nuanced and intricate disagreements with Husserl and Heidegger on the nature of (respectively) intentionality and ek-stasis are clearly family squabbles.

On the face of it, however, Deleuze's materialism, his transcendental empiricism, is not phenomenological at all: it is transcendental precisely because in it the empirical is understood neither within the structures of phenomenality and objecthood nor at their limit as the (merely) unrepresentable condition of representation -- be it a Heideggerian ek-stasis of Being or Henry's en-static and sub-reflective immanence of affect. These fundamentally epistemological problematics, with their characteristic squeamishness about what one is permitted to say, are quite foreign to Deleuze. Matter in Deleuze is pure exteriority, i.e. exteriority that does not require an interiority; but which can, under certain circumstances, fold in on itself to form an interior without ceasing to be exteriority. Interiorization is the material condition under which, among other things, phenomenality can develop, but phenomenality does not exhaust its condition. In Kantian terms: phenomenology occupies the space of the empirically real, with its conceptual forms, material content and basic division into subject and object; but Deleuze's empiricism is transcendental because it migrates the transcendental machinery of object-production beyond the phenomenal realm into that of the thing in itself, the Real, the transcendental unconscious.

Mullarkey however repeatedly construes Deleuze's materialism within a phenomenological (168), or even pre-critical phenomenalist ambit. He reads, for instance, Deleuze's early analysis of Hume as a general endorsement of Humean phenomenalist empiricism (39-40), a cavalier reading at best, and clearly belied by the materialist Kantian complication that Deleuze's empiricism undergoes in the two volumes of Capitalism and Schizophrenia. It is certainly possible to disagree with what Deleuze is doing; even to think it naïve (there is no escape from the structures of phenomenality or their recessive conditions; Deleuze's matter is merely posited, an arbitrary decision etc). These are reasonable points; but no objection is advanced by simply refusing to acknowledge what Deleuze clearly thinks he is doing.

Mullarkey's immanent materialization of self-relation in the diagram derives from Henry's conception and shares with it a principled rejection of explanation. In a way this is odd because Mullarkey describes his position as actualist. This doctrine is usually understood as the denial that possibilities exist and its chief intellectual challenge is how to account for modal statements without such a two-stage ontology. One might expect Mullarkey's immanent actualism to stimulate an analogous explanatory challenge: how to account for the apparently non-actual on the basis of the actual. But Mullarkey repeatedly blocks this challenge by arguing for example that even the appearance of transcendence is already transcendence. Thus even to admit that there is something to explain is already to have made it impossible to explain it on the basis of immanence. So Mullarkey's solution to the explanatory co-dependency between Badiou and Henry is to eschew explanation itself. Mullarkey's radical value-neutrality, descriptivism and his ultimately mute conception of the philosophical diagram all follow once explanation has been blocked. Deleuze's materialization of self-relation by contrast rises to the challenge, and so perhaps it is not surprising that it should have been occluded in Mullarkey's account.