Post-Rationalism: Psychoanalysis, Epistemology, and Marxism in Post-War France

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Tom Eyers, Post-Rationalism: Psychoanalysis, Epistemology, and Marxism in Post-War France, Bloomsbury, 2013, 217pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441186881.

Reviewed by William McBride, Purdue University


This is a book that lives up to its main title, but does not live up at least to the final part of its ambitious sub-title. The war being referenced is World War II, and so the post-war period in question is just over two-thirds of a century long. The volume takes as its principal textual focus a short-lived publication entitled Cahiers pour l'Analyse, the product of some "precocious" (p. 2) students of the Ecole Normale Supérieure in Paris beginning in 1966. Both Louis Althusser and Jacques Derrida were members of the ENS faculty, and one of the contributors, Jacques-Alain Miller, as Tom Eyers informs us in one of his very rare biographical forays (p. 14), was the future son-in-law of Jacques Lacan, whose influence on this group was considerable. Hence the "psychoanalysis" part of the sub-title is warranted. But the "Marxism" part relies almost exclusively on the role played by Althusser, who of course considered himself to be a Marxist; however, his claims in the domain of Marxist theory, other than his evolving views of the relationship between science and ideology, in fact receive no significant attention here.

But epistemology -- ah, that is a different matter. In a certain sense, this book is almost all about epistemology as understood from the broad perspective of what outsiders, especially American outsiders, liked to call "structuralism" -- and, later, "post-structuralism." Eyers finds these labels somewhat misleading and so has invented the term "post-rationalism" for the literature that he is considering, in part because he thinks that empiricists are attacking a straw man when they accuse rationalists of remaining within the domain of pure concepts, pure ideas; the "post-rationalists" of his title, Eyers contends, managed to get beyond the rationalism/empiricism split (p. 73). As for the concept of "structure" itself, the author wants to insist that most of the writers in question, with the notable exception of the very young Alain Badiou in a Cahiers essay entitled "Mark and Lack," depart from the stereotypical conceit of structuralism as rigid formalism and instead accept the idea of an inherent instability in structures.

The book is divided into five main chapters plus a brief introduction and a briefer conclusion, each of the chapters being divided into small sub-sections. The first chapter features psychoanalytic structuralism, the second Gaston Bachelard and Lacan, the third the notions of science and "suture", the fourth Althusser, Badiou, Lacan, and Jean-Claude Milner, and the fifth the thoughts of Gilles Deleuze and Georges Canguilhem with special emphasis on the concept of "life." In addition to those already mentioned, other philosophers, one or more of whose writings are touched upon, are Jacques-Alain Miller, Pierre Macherey, and Serge Leclaire. Apart from the concluding chapter, about which more anon, I have now named virtually the entire range of thinkers examined in this book.

A few others appear from time to time, it is true. For example, in connection with the Cahiers contributors' exploration of, among other things, the meaning of Lacan's "objet petit a" within his theory of the subject, an essay by Luce Irigaray on the "mirror stage" of human development is referenced in a sub-section of Chapter 1 entitled "Excursus on specularity -- Irigaray." (p. 23) After devoting three and one-half pages to Irigaray's essay, and mid-way through the sub-section, Eyers returns, as he puts it, to the related Cahiers essay by André Green with which he was dealing earlier in the chapter and allows Irigaray to vanish into thin air, as it were. (She is mentioned, but only in passing, twice later in the book.) Late in the same chapter Althusser is introduced, in the first place because Eyers wishes to stress the importance of his influence on the Cahiers writers (a number of whom were, after all, his students). But then, commenting on Althusser's grappling with the problem of contingency, he raises quite a different point, which, although also not pursued in any systematic way, seems to me apt:

As a parenthesis, we might ask whether the strict dialectic between contingency and continuity that seems to define Althusser's project, and to a lesser extent Lacan's and those of the Cahiers writers, is a symptom of a collective inability to properly conceptualize history and time. (p. 40)

A good question, and one that should probably be raised concerning this book itself. Of course its author is familiar with the chronology of his subjects, but the often haphazard nature of the book's structure makes it especially desirable that details of historical sequence and historical setting be introduced into the text; too often they are not. I began this review by identifying the meaning of "post-war" as intended in the book's sub-title. But that war ended, for the French, more than twenty years before the publication of the first issue of the Cahiers. In the first sentence of Chapter 1, Eyers says that the period "since the end of the war" had seen "a partial, but frequently exaggerated eclipse of the projects of both post-Husserlian phenomenology and Sartrean existentialism." (p. 13) I am not sure who is supposed to have exaggerated this eclipse, but it seems very hard to contest the claim that the immediate post-war period was the time of maximum success of existentialism, at least, if not of phenomenology generally, in France. In any case, Sartre's name never recurs, even adjectivally, in the book, while the names of Maurice Merleau-Ponty, Simone de Beauvoir, and Martin Heidegger, who were all arguably of considerable importance in the intellectual life of post-War France, do not appear at all. (Husserl's does appear one more time, à propos of a congratulatory comment by Miller on Derrida's handling of him in a Cahiers essay.) (p. 103) Bachelard, on the other hand, while he lived a long life and published some important reflections on rationalism during the post-war period, had already made a name for himself as a philosopher of science, as well as an important influence on literary criticism, before the war began; his The Formation of the Scientific Mind, for example, to which Eyers refers with some frequency in Chapter 2, was published in 1938. He was an important influence on Canguilhem, who succeeded him as Director of the Institut d'histoire des sciences in 1955. Canguilhem was an advisor to the young Derrida, and his most important publications appeared well before 1966.

Few of these historical connections are made very clear in Post-Rationalism, in which the overall sociocultural context is for the most part disregarded or at best treated as comparatively insignificant. At the beginning of Chapter 5, it is true, Eyers recounts a division once advanced by Michel Foucault, characterized as "an orthodoxy that continues to gain ground," according to which there are two main streams of Twentieth Century French philosophy, the first being associated with Bergson, Deleuze, and some unnamed phenomenologists, and emphasizing the experiential basis of life, the other indebted to the philosophy of science and including such great names as Bachelard, Canguilhem, Althusser, Lévi-Strauss, Lacan, and, of course, Foucault himself. (p. 153) In his ensuing comparison of Canguilhem and Deleuze concerning "the problem of life," Eyers tries to problematize this division to some extent, and for that he deserves credit. But the whole rich and sometimes bizarre world of his principal protagonists during the period of the late 1960s upon which he most focuses, at least at the beginning of his book, is not even hinted at. It was a time of would-be revolution -- and not merely in philosophy -- and, after the setbacks of 1968 (in which Althusser played an important and not especially heroic role), of the nascent movement of the so-called "Maos," some of whom had connections with the ENS. Many readers of this book will surely know all this already, but it is not a part of Eyers' narrative.

Curiously, "politics" does finally appear in the brief "Conclusion" to Post-Rationalism; it is one word in a long sub-title introducing one of the three "case studies" that are treated there, that of Jacques Rancière, a treatment that occupies less than two full pages of print. The other two are the later work of Badiou, most notably his 1982 book, Theory of the Subject (four pages), and finally the so-called "nonphilosophy" of François Laruelle (three and a half pages), the explanation of whose admittedly almost impenetrable work is not greatly advanced by this presentation. In short, the Conclusion is fairly inconclusive, and in any case it is mostly about something other than the rest.

There was a time when philosophers interested in the evolution of French thought would solemnly lament, or alternatively rejoice in, the "death of the subject" (as in "je") that was supposed to have occurred in that milieu. Eyers' frequent recurrence to this topic -- in Lacan's references to "suture," meaning "the stitching of the subject to the signifier" (p. 31), in Althusser's and Badiou's changing views on it, and so on -- has the great merit of laying that idea to rest. In addition, although Eyers presupposes far too much prior knowledge on his reader's part of the intellectual atmosphere that he is exploring and especially of Lacanian theory, he does provide helpful synopses of a number of the Cahiers essays. On the other hand, he treats Althusser's publications with a respect that they, as distinguished from his obviously inspirational effect on some of his students, do not seem to me to deserve. Opinions about this and many other topics discussed in Post-Rationalism will no doubt continue to differ. But, at any rate, for those idealistically seeking more comprehensive insights into the philosophical life and times of "post-war France," this book is likely to seem disappointing.