Postmetaphysical Thinking II

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Jürgen Habermas, Postmetaphysical Thinking II, Ciaran Cronin (tr.), Polity, 2017, 276 pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780745682150.

Reviewed by Peter Dews, University of Essex


It is hard to think of a contemporary philosopher whose achievement rivals that of Jürgen Habermas, in terms of range, comprehensiveness and ambition. After more than sixty years of intellectual endeavour, Habermas has accumulated an oeuvre which not only stands in the tradition of the great systematic social thinkers of the nineteenth and early twentieth century — Hegel, Marx, Durkheim, Weber — but can claim a dignified place beside them. His writings have dealt with the philosophy of language and communication, the basis of moral consciousness, the philosophy of history and the evolution of social life since the dawn of human time, sociological theory on the grand scale, political philosophy and legal theory, and — increasingly — the philosophy of religion. In addition to these multiple strands of activity, over the years Habermas has also published twelve volumes of Kleine Politische Schriften, his interventions — sometimes more academic, sometimes more journalistic and even polemical — on topical social and political issues. How to orient oneself in this vast body of work?

One way we might do so is by marking major phases in Habermas’s philosophical development. From this perspective, his thinking can be broadly divided into three stages: from the mid-1950s, when he worked as Theodor Adorno’s assistant in Frankfurt, to the end of the 1960s, after which he turned toward detailed work on his philosophy of language and so-called ‘discourse ethics’ (more correctly described as a discourse theory of moral validity); from the 1970s to the late 1980s, during which time he also published The Theory of Communicative Action, a two-volume summa of his social theory; and from 1988, when he put out a first volume of essays entitled ‘Postmetaphysical Thinking,’ up until the present. As the successor volume — which appeared in German in 2012 — makes clear, the case for marking these particular points as significant turns in Habermas’s philosophical development is bound up with his fluctuating level of confidence in the scope and power of communicative rationality.

As an inheritor of the Hegelian-Marxist tradition of the Frankfurt School, Habermas began with the assumption that humankind can be understood as a kind of macro-subject of its own history — albeit, so far, in an unconscious, self-estranged guise. Hence, up until the publication of Knowledge and Human Interests in the late 1960s, he conceived of critical social theory as helping members of modern societies to become aware of and capable of overcoming the unperceived constraints and ideological rigidities which prevent them from collectively shaping the social order they inhabit. However, in a response to the book, his lifelong friend and colleague Karl-Otto Apel pointed out that Habermas had conflated two distinct meanings of self-reflection. The type of self-reflection achieved, for example, by the patient in psychoanalysis — who begins to penetrate and comprehend the opacities of her individual life history — is a process quite distinct from the kind of transcendental reflection inaugurated by Kant, which seeks to delineate the universal structures underpinning cognition and other human competencies. Such a conflation, Apel argued, is dangerous, because it encourages the belief that reflective political engagement in a risk-laden concrete situation could itself have the status of a kind of science. (Wissenschaft als Emanzipation?, 152-154)

Habermas took this lesson fully to heart, and ever since has distinguished between a hermeneutic function of philosophy, as an interpreter of particular life-worlds, and a quasi-transcendental role which he terms ‘rational reconstruction.’ In the next phase of his work, he concentrated mainly on the second type of activity. In the domain of moral philosophy, the enormous task he set himself was nonchalantly expressed on the back cover of the English translation of his Moral Consciousness and Communicative Action (1983): ‘[Habermas] aims to show that our basic moral intuitions spring from something deeper and more universal than contingent features of our tradition, namely from normative presuppositions of social interaction that belong to the repertoire of competent agents in any society.’

Habermas’s ‘middle period,’ in other words, represents the high point of his rationalism. His principal efforts were directed to proving the meaningfulness of seeking ultimate agreement regarding cognitive truth and practical morality, by showing that simply to engage with one another in discussion commits us to the ideal of a universally valid consensus in normative and theoretical matters. Correlatively, in developing his social theory, Habermas sought to defend the progressive potential of the modern differentiation of institutionalized discourses (structured forms of open, egalitarian argumentation) dealing with scientific knowledge-claims, claims to morality and justice, and claims to expressive authenticity (pre-eminently in the form of works of art). The separating-out in the modern world of cognitive, normative and expressive validity, foreshadowed by the architectonic of Kant’s three Critiques, must be regarded as an historic advance, Habermas contends, because it opens avenues towards a rational, argumentative resolution of disputes regarding validity in different spheres. This possibility is not available when epistemic issues are mixed up with normative and evaluative ones, as was standardly the case in the pre-modern world. At the same time, Habermas’s conviction that the separation of value spheres is an irreversible achievement, grounded in the fundamental logic of human discourse, underpins his claim that contemporary philosophy must operate in a manner which is ‘post-metaphysical.’

Since the nature and status of metaphysics is itself a matter of endless dispute, it may be as well to formulate at the outset the core of what Habermas means by the term. For him, metaphysics is the enterprise of framing a comprehensive view of the world, and the place of human beings within it, in which cognitive, normative and evaluative perspectives are fused. The scholastic motto, ‘unum, verum et bonum convertuntur,’ can therefore stand as an epigraph for the Habermasian view of metaphysics. According to him, this enterprise is no longer plausible, because philosophy must also bow to the separation of validity spheres, and conceive of itself either as collaborative Wissenschaft, seeking universal structures underpinning human capabilities, or merely as the reflexive illumination of a particular socio-cultural world. The age of the philosopher as prophet or visionary, as represented in twentieth-century Germany by the fateful example of Heidegger, is over — notwithstanding the occasional theatrics of thinkers domiciled in Paris.

This brings us to what can be regarded as the third major phase of Habermas’s work. In his first essay collection with the title ‘Postmetaphysical Thinking,’ Habermas begins to hint that, although philosophy must cease to pride itself on access to truths superior to those established by the fallibilistic enterprise of science, it nevertheless needs to draw on sources of inspiration — on ‘semantic contents’ or ‘semantic potentials’ — which spring from a level of experience prior to the separation of validity spheres. I emphasize the word ‘hint’: as yet, Habermas does little to spell out the reasons for this dependency, but it is possible to read between the lines. The theory of communicative reason does not offer us the image of a possible future condition of free and egalitarian intersubjective relations. Or rather, to the extent that it generates such utopian images, these are merely — Habermas stresses — a ‘transcendental illusion.’ The only ‘moment of unconditionality,’ the only absolute, which it has to offer us is ‘an absolute made fluid as a critical procedure.’ (Postmetaphysical Thinking, 144) But in what sense can such a conception of philosophy still claim to be emancipatory? Does not a critical philosophy need to provide motivating insights into the core of human existence and its drive to transcend the given — and not simply define the formal conditions of justice and freedom? In Postmetaphysical Thinking Habermas begins to portray religion as a reservoir of such insights, with which philosophy must learn to co-exist, and from which it can indeed learn. Our religious traditions, he suggests, still resonate in the semantic depths of our fundamental moral and ethical concepts — even in the anemic versions of them traded by professional philosophers.

‘Postmetaphysical thinking,’ as Habermas defines it, then, is obliged to walk a tightrope. It renounces as outdated any philosophical vision of the world imbued with substantive values. But then it finds itself intimately linked to extra-philosophical sources of meaning — pre-eminently religion — that are characterized by a fusion of validity spheres. It needs this connection in order to make up for what it has renounced by insisting on their separation. Shorn of its age-old pretentions, philosophy may struggle to find equivalents ‘in the medium of reason-giving speech’ (im Medium begründender Rede) for what religion still often says better. (Postmetaphysical Thinking, 145) In the quarter of a century which lies between the publication of the first collection entitled ‘Postmetaphysical Thinking’ and its successor, Habermas has devoted much of his energy to exploring the philosophical, theological and political issues raised by this disconcerting situation. Its socio-historical correlate — so he argues — is the emergence of a ‘post-secular’ society (a society which can no longer regard religion merely as a historical residue, or anticipate the disappearance of religion as the terminus of its own modernization processes). What balance sheet can we draw up of his tackling of these issues, on the evidence of the current volume?

The volume is divided into three parts, each of which deals with the interface between philosophy — or, more generally, rational argumentative discourse — and religion, but focuses on a distinct domain of philosophical enquiry. In Part I, Habermas deals with the function of myth and religious ritual as integral to the emergence of human society as such. He also offers a grand historical schema for mapping the evolving relation between philosophy and religious consciousness, stretching from the ‘axial age’ (the period of the founding of the world’s great religious traditions — roughly around the middle of the first millenium BCE), right up to the post-modern theology of the present. Part II is concerned with the venerable question of the relation between faith and knowledge; with his habitual intellectual generosity, Habermas offers extensive, thoughtful and learned responses to the papers which were presented by theologians and philosophers of religion at two conferences devoted to his work, in New York and Vienna. In the final part he addresses the thorny and acutely topical question of the political relations between the secular and religious citizens of contemporary states, taking as his most important interlocutor John Rawls.

As might be inferred from what I have said so far, from the late 1980s onwards Habermas began to worry more and more that a Vernunftmoral in the lineage of Kant — such as he takes his own discourse ethics to be — pays for its secular universalism with a lack of inspiring and motivational power. Throughout his career, he had intermittently expressed the concern that, in modernity, ‘meaning is a scarce resource which is becoming ever scarcer’ — and one, furthermore, which cannot be regenerated by bureaucratic or administrative means. (Legitimation Crisis, 73) But now this problem becomes much more central to his thinking. Habermas’s new emphasis on the notion that religious faith, which — as he stresses — has an ‘opacity’ resistant to the kind of conceptual appropriation which Hegel assumed possible, may remain a reservoir of meaning and insight, already set a limit to the scope of reason-giving. But, in the first part he concedes further weaknesses of purely discursive procedures.

Habermas argues that a distinctively human form of social life first emerged when action-coordination became dependent on the communicative forging of a shared perspective on objects in the world — a feat of which higher primates, despite their intelligence and ability to use signals, are not capable. However, the distinctively human need to use language to secure social collaboration puts stresses and strains on the individual, who is thrown back on her own initiative in new ways. Habermas refers to the ‘crisis experience of groundless hovering’ of an existence which is ‘handed over to the collective’ and yet which has to be ‘“performed” by individuals.’ (54) He then argues, building on Durkheim, that religious ritual functions as a compensating mechanism, stabilizing the newly fluid norms of social life by re-enacting the process of their generation. This means, Habermas suggests, that — still in the present day — believers, through the liturgical practices which are integral to any faith, have access to ‘an archaic experience’ and to ‘a source of solidarity’ which is closed to the ‘unbelieving sons and daughters of modernity.’ (56) Such a conception represents a major shift of emphasis from Habermas’s middle-period philosophy, which paid little heed to the affectivity required to sustain a universalistic morality, and in which the ‘ideal speech situation,’ a counterfactual projection of the normativity of the eirenic activity of exchanging reasons, was assumed to be capable of absorbing the transcendent aspirations of religion, at least in the long term.

In the final part, Habermas explores the implications for democratic politics of this acknowledgement of the enduring roots of religion in the basic dynamics of human sociality. Drawing again on his long-standing distinction between the ‘public sphere’ of informal political argument and debate and the institutionalized arena of political discussion and decision-taking, he argues that religious believers should not be required to express their political and moral convictions in a language directly accessible to non-believing interlocutors, before they can intervene on moral-political issues. Such a demand, as put forward by Rawls, would place an unreasonable strain on individuals who are not in a position to separate their religious perspective on practical matters from their whole way of being in the world. In short, it would fail adequately to respect the distinction between fides quae creditur and fides qua creditur — between articles of belief and a lived faith. At the same time, according to Habermas, elected legislators, judges, and other public officials, are under an obligation to frame their decisions in a neutral, secular language, in order that their reasons be accessible to all citizens. He conceives of this balancing act as dependent on a reciprocal learning process, in which religious believers come to acknowledge the legitimacy of other faiths, the epistemic standing of modern science, and the principles of the liberal democratic order from which they too benefit, while non-believers treat their religious fellow citizens without condescension, and even remain open to insights which may be encapsulated in the language of a faith they do not share.

Habermas likes to portray such a situation as giving the dialectic of enlightenment one more twist. An enlightenment which is enlightened about itself will not mistake the secularistic for the secular, it will not refuse to accept citizens as ‘modern contemporaries’ because of their religious convictions, and will not rigidly insist that the outer limit of discursive rationality is the outer limit of meaning — on the contrary. But it is interesting to ask whether Habermas can present his conception of the relation between religious faith and its theological self-explications, on the one hand, and ‘postmetaphysical thinking,’ on the other, as a similar case of a further dialectical loop in a philosophical project which remains basically on track.

Habermas is strongly inclined to present ‘postmetaphysical thinking’ as the appropriate mode of philosophical (and, for him, therefore, secular) consciousness for a ‘post-secular’ society. Indeed, this is the guiding theme of an earlier collection of essays — Between Naturalism and Religion. As a form of ‘soft naturalism,’ such thinking resists the inflation of the natural scientific approach to reality into a naturalistic Weltanschauung, whose adherents are often aggressively eager to shove religious doctrines from the world-historical stage. Rather, postmetaphysical thinking insists on the distinction between faith and knowledge, and — in relation to religion — remains ‘ready to learn and agnostic at the same time.’ (Between Naturalism and Religion, 143) However, Habermas’s version of soft naturalism has quite distinctive features which throw doubt on the niche which he tries to carve out for it — mid-way between an overweening scientism inflated into a new, reductionist metaphysics, on the one hand, and the ‘existential certainties’ of religion, on the other.

Soft naturalists typically argue that the human world of meaning, mentation and responsible agency, and the world viewed as a causal nexus of physical processes are not in conflict with one another. It is simply a matter of two equally valid perspectives between ­­which human beings are able to shift. Many soft naturalists are happy to leave it at that, indifferent to the objection that perspectives that expect to be taken seriously imply ontological commitments. However, the systematic thrust of Habermas’s thinking — his reconfiguration of German Idealism, we might say — does not allow him this shoulder-shrugging option. For him, the human life-world is constituted and interpreted by means of a repertoire of concepts incommensurable with those of the natural sciences. But it is embedded within an objective world which we moderns take the natural sciences to represent truthfully, yet which still performs an overall ‘unifying function.’ (24) In consequence, he asserts, ‘Reason is “dissatisfied” with a form of ontological dualism that erupts within the world itself and is not merely epistemic in nature.’ (25) To heal the wound, we ‘must not capitulate before the black hole represented by the ontological question of the origin and existence of the life-world.’ (26) But what kind of knowing — neither straightforwardly scientific nor hermeneutic — could begin to provide answers to that question? Habermas is all too aware that he may simply be inviting metaphysics in through the back door.

But this problem connects with another major issue. Habermas’s theory of communicative action assumes the capacity of human beings to orient themselves by means of validity-concepts (e.g. cognitive ‘truth,’ moral ‘rightness’) which, as he often asserts, ‘go beyond all contexts.’ (82) They imply an ultimate detachment from the limits of space and time. It is this which accounts for what he refers to as the ‘peculiar ontic groundlessness of the life-world.’ (26) Habermas concedes the possibility of giving this groundlessness a religious interpretation (one might think, for example, of Martin Buber’s non-objectifiable ‘Thou’ or Levinas’s ‘Other’), but insists that his own philosophy requires only a modest ‘transcendence from within’ (82) — it does not rely on a divine transcendence which erupts into the here and now. But is this a distinction without a difference? After all, regardless of the direction we portray the transcending movement as taking, it cannot occur at all without a division — and a gap — between our finite, mortal world and a ‘beyond’ of some kind. And, even for ‘postmetaphysical thinking,’ the distinctive texture of the human world depends on such a transcendent dimension. Evoking the first emergence of human social life, Habermas asserts that ‘the socialization of intelligence leads to the instituting of the new authority of the trans-subjective logos of language.’ (55) But since, as he has long insisted, it is this logos — this imperturbable, pervasive power of reason — to which human beings must defer, if they wish to leave in peace and harmony with one another, we may well begin to wonder in what sense he does not believe in God.


Note: Cited translations from German have sometimes been modified.

Karl-Otto Apel, ‘Wissenschaft als Emanzipation? — Eine kritische Würdigung der Wissenschaftskonzeption der “Kritischen Theorie,”’ in Transformation der Philosophie, Band 2, Frankfurt-am-Main 1976, pp. 128-154.

Jürgen Habermas, Legitimation Crisis, trans. Thomas McCarthy, Cambridge 1988.

Jürgen Habermas, Postmetaphysical Thinking, trans. William Mark Hohengarten, Cambridge 1992.

Jürgen Habermas, Between Naturalism and Religion, trans. Ciaran Cronin, Cambridge 2008.