Postmodern Philosophy and the Scientific Turn

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Dorothea E. Olkowski, Postmodern Philosophy and the Scientific Turn, Indiana University Press, 2012, 248pp., $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253001191.

Reviewed by Helen A. Fielding, Western University, Ontario


In what ways do science and philosophy mutually influence one another? And in what ways can this relational influence be productive, science recognizing its own ethical implications and philosophy acknowledging the science that structures it? Dorothea Olkowski takes on these questions in a remarkably lucid analysis of the relationship between philosophy and science in order, specifically, to consider the ontological and ethical consequences of the scientific turn in recent postmodern philosophy. One of Olkowski's significant contributions is to explain how understanding the science behind the philosophies with which one engages -- and it does seem that there is a scientific structure behind each philosophy -- makes one better able to grasp their possibilities and limits. She clarifies, for example, how Gilles Deleuze's drawing on classical thermodynamics, which relies on a closed and isolated system, limits his approach.  Such an overview that provides historical context, as well as a detailed and expert discussion of the science, is timely; it is also essential reading for those of us who are not experts in science to understand what is at stake in the philosophies with which we engage, and for those who are experts to get a sense of what is at stake in the work that they do. The book makes a strong argument for nonequilibrium thermodynamics over classical theories, and for Hannah Arendt's and Simone de Beauvoir's phenomenological approaches over Deleuze's and even Jean-Paul Sartre's postmodern functionalism.

The scientific turn, which provides the focus for this book, seems to parallel what is commonly referred to as the linguistic turn. The latter, among continental philosophers, marked a rejection of some of the presuppositions of phenomenology and hermeneutics, which were themselves responses to logical positivism and functionalism. What is surprising to Olkowski is that there are postmodern philosophies that reject phenomenological premises by returning to a kind of formalism, or as she also calls it, functionalism, that is more in keeping with the positivism phenomenologists critiqued. Moreover, in refusing grand narratives, postmoderns turn to what Olkowski describes as "language games," or cultural conventions that shape and validate individuals' language usage. The "systems of conventions" allow words to "perform certain functions" that speakers learn to use (xii). For the analytics, these functions are realized through formal semantics, and for postmoderns through semiology. What changes for both is that words gain significance through function.

In short, for some postmodern philosophers, in rejecting both metaphysical illusion as well as intuitions, all that matters are the "formal, structural relations among signifiers" (xiii). The arbitrary relation between the signifier and the signified means that signs can signify anything and meaning becomes irrelevant. Not only is any concept of truth abandoned, but some philosophers also project "mathematical structures onto physical reality". For these philosophers, as Olkowski explains it, we are not caught up only in "the 'prison house of language'." Instead, "we might find that these philosophies place us in a prison house of sensation, perception, thought and experience from which there is no escape" (xx). In this "field of immanence", or "wholly determined vector field", expression and intentions are "irrelevant". There is no truth, no responsibility, and there are no consequences, and above all, no authors.

Beginning with an account of the Sokal affair, Olkowski investigates the historical conditions that lead to the point where Sokal, with other physicists, could claim that there is a "near absolute separation between what [he] calls the external world with its eternal physical laws and mere humanity" (3). This separation of science and world emerges as the experiment that abstracts a natural phenomenon from its environment, setting up in advance the reality from which the truth will be discovered. As Arendt describes it, mathematics replaces thinking, which is a withdrawal from but not a rejection of the world of appearance and sensation, as the "structure of the human mind" (18). Two things happened that made this possible. First geometry, as the "extension of nature and the world", became expressible in algebraic formulae. Second, analytical geometry was able to prove that "numerical truths are fully representable in terms of space" (10). The consequence of these two moves was the conclusion that nothing more than mathematics, least of all immediate sensible intuition, was required for scientific investigation. It also meant that "observation-based reflection on lived experience", which had previously motivated philosophy as well as political speech and action, is no longer needed or even acknowledged by the natural sciences.

As Olkowski explains in chapter two, Newton advanced the presuppositions of mathematical science maintaining that we cannot rely on our senses, and that to comprehend "space, time and motion" things should be considered in themselves (26). Importantly, Newtonian or classical mechanics, as she explains, is deterministic. This means that classical mechanical systems are time reversible as well as atomistic; both the past and the future can be revealed with certainty. But certainty can only be attained because these systems are isolated or closed. Olkowski's point is that classical mechanics spills over into philosophy. In John Locke's philosophy, for example, we see a world where it is the laws of nature that "determine the limits of human action" (28). It is an "empirical world of testable hypotheses, a mathematically deterministic world organized on the basis of atomic sense data, and the external association of ideas derived from that sense data, giving rise to a social contract whose rules would guarantee a social and economic reality that would itself be closed, deterministic, atomistic and, if need be potentially reversible" (32). Accordingly, if the social realm follows nature, and if it is organized according to the predictable laws of nature that are mathematically demonstrable, then a rational, orderly and organized society will be the outcome. But what happens, Olkowski asks, to those human sensibilities that do not conform to what is predicted?

She follows the move in science from determinism to probability in chapter three, and from classical mechanics to classical thermodynamics, but this move does not imply a shift away from closed and isolated classical systems, for, in addition we have the state of equilibrium "where no further changes take place" (46). Because thermodynamics is a study of energy, work and heat, it applies to processes. In fact, what is now studied are processes rather than things, and this applies as well to philosophical questions such as those pertaining to "determinism and freedom". Olkowski identifies Deleuze as a philosopher who in particular draws on classical thermodynamics for his understanding of chaos. But as Olkowski observes, this system can only apply to non-complex systems of "energy changing forms" (48). And it is a system that is governed by entropy, the state whereby energy is available to change forms until it is no longer able to change "or make other things change". In contrast to classical thermodynamics, Olkowski sees new possibilities in Isabelle Stengers' and Ilya Prigogine's concept of nature, that is, in nonequilibrum thermodynamics or, the "science of flow", for providing the possibility that philosophy and science might once again influence one another. She turns to Stengers' distinction between phenomenological and fundamental laws; the first are "correlated with irreversible evolutions" and the second with "the reversible processes of classical physics". Moving beyond classical physics' insistence on the predictability of processes, Stengers and Prigogine describe instead a "concept of nature as open, complex, probabilistic and temporally irreversible" (52).

In chapter four Olkowski explains that classical theories privilege space, but that an alternative lies in prioritizing time. First, she provides a clear and convincing critique of Deleuze's reliance on classical thermodynamics. By contrast, in nonequilibrium thermodynamics, according to Stengers and Prigogine, time replaces "general, all-embracing schemes . . . expressed by eternal laws" (60). If we remember that in classical science, there is no "temporal evolution", and "the different and the changing" are reduced to "the identical and permanent", then already there's a problem. Certainly Deleuze has moved beyond Newton's "closed and certain universe"; nevertheless, Olkowski describes Deleuze as committed to the view from nowhere, for limiting the meaning of human experience, and for having a concept of time that includes reversibility. I can only gesture towards some of the intricate details here, but essentially Olkowski convincingly argues that Deleuze rejects an open-system thermodynamics and instead theorizes an immanent system,which means it is still closed and deterministic as well as atomistic. Since its processes occur at the molecular level at speeds beyond that of light, it is at least not "immediately reduced to entropic equilibrium." Although it is chaotic, it is still deterministic because "once established, the rules governing the field of thought do not alter" (66). The event in this system has a "formal mathematical name", the "catastrophe", which, as I understand it, is traced mathematically on an abstract surface. As a shift in the fixed point in the system, the catastrophe causes temporary instability but only until the system shifts to the area of the new fixed point. In this spatial system there is time reversibility and no space of experience. In fact, for Deleuze, "every subject or object is an event, nothing but the result of contingent encounters of affects and percepts" (75). These affects and percepts are independent of subjects and objects. What is produced are configurations of particles in a "deterministically chaotic world" that is governed by the rules of connection, conjunction, and disjunction. Dynamical systems prioritize space over time because they are characterized by a "trajectory" that negates each preceding point so that the past does not affect the present, for "each past point is a unique, infinitesimal position on an x/y axis" (121). It is a world where "space and time are given, not emergent" (85).

Olkowski next explores the consequences of this science for ethics. She points out that "no existence can found itself moment by moment. Moral freedom requires a past and a future" (122). Accordingly, in chapter five she addresses the question of the relation between human actions and the worldviews created according to particular structures of natural science. At stake are ontologies that do not, in fact, disregard ethics and that do take human affectivity into account. As Arendt reminds us, unlike the experiment of modern science, actions are unpredictable and human affairs can never be determined in advance. Olkowski takes this up through an original and engaging reading of Alice in Wonderland, my favorite part of her book. Contrary to postmodern readings of Alice, Deleuze's in particular, Alice is not the story of a girl who discovers the end of identity, and celebrates the absence of sense. Instead, she discovers that she does not want to live in a world where there are no consequences, no identity, and no reference. More specifically, in Wonderland anything is possible because propositions can be "stated as linear and causal hypotheticals . . . transformed into a series of disjunctions bearing no causal relation to one another" (105). And where there is no causality there are no consequences. Olkowski asks, "why organize language so as to escape causal relations, unless to eliminate the possibility that a little girl might grow up and that words and deeds have unpredictable effects" (117)?

In the final chapter, Olkowski makes a claim for nonequilibrium thermodynamics, and for intuitionism over formalist, postmodern theories that take social and cultural contexts as determining. For intuitionists, alternatively, language "is a product of consensus" that makes "social organization possible", but language users can and do "reinterpret language", which means that "the unexpected is always possible" (128). Olkowski draws on intuitionist mathematics as well as on the philosophies of Arendt and Beauvoir to argue that "choosing and willing take time". She also turns to the theories of physicist Fotini Markopoulou, who argues that space, that is, geometry, "is not fundamental in the universe". The rules of association, commutation and distribution belong to mathematics and thus define vector space. These are the same rules, Olkowski tells us, that govern Kantian practical reason. Following Markopoulou, Olkowski opts for a "distinction between two kinds of time, the geometric and the fundamental" (138). She suggests that though geometric time is marked by symmetry, it is fundamental time that is real. For matter only comes into appearance when "the universe starts to cool down". This is not the place to fully explore Olkowski's compelling argument, but her main point is that philosophers do need science but they need the right one.  This is a science that accounts not simply for structures of matter that organize our society, but also does not "ignore the actions of people in that society".  Olkowski, like Markopoulou, suggests that, rather than relying on a pre-established space-time manifold,"the model of quantum causal histories specifies that spacetime and the states that evolve, the stage and the actors, evolve together" (142). This is in short an intuitionist account whereby the past informs the present and evolves into "an open future".

I have understood Olkowski's goal as to show how philosophy and postmodern philosophies in particular, rely on scientific structures, and how for science to ignore the social, to ignore words and deeds, makes it, in short, bad science. This book is clear, but that does not mean it is not complex. Nevertheless, the struggle is rewarding; I highly recommend it.