Postmodernity's Transcending: Devaluing God

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Laurence Paul Hemming, Postmodernity's Transcending: Devaluing God, University of Notre Dame Press, 2005, 269pp, $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521795346.

Reviewed by Mary Troxell, Boston College


In Postmodernity's Transcending, Paul Hemming attempts to show that postmodern discussions of God and sublimity rest on modern presuppositions that, he argues, are out of place. He does so by attempting a genealogy of the sublime or, to use the term he prefers, upliftment. More specifically, he attempts to show that the postmodern understanding of the sublime, no less than the modern understanding, rests on a devaluing of God, a devaluing, he argues, that has its origins in an understanding of God as the highest source of value. In tracing the history of the notion of the sublime, Hemming wishes to demonstrate in a new way how the modern ontotheological understanding of God and being emerges and how it is retained in postmodern thought. Moreover, in tracing the notion of the sublime, Hemming uncovers fundamental shifts in the way we understand the temporal structures of the self, world and God.

Hemming begins his analysis with an overview of postmodernism and how postmodernism conceives of the sublime. Hemming takes his bearings from Lyotard's famous definition of the postmodern condition, as an incredulity toward meta-narratives, and he employs Žižek's discussion of sublimity, as well as that of Sam Taylor-Wood's installation Brontosaurus, to explain the postmodern notion of the sublime. In general, postmodernism conceives of the sublime as the experience of a singular, isolated and dislocated subject who creates her subjectivity anew in each moment as she experiences a breakdown of her own subjectivity.

After his overview of the postmodern sublime, Hemming begins his historical analysis with Longinus's treatise, On the Sublime. Hemming intends to demonstrate that Longinus both presupposes the understanding of divinity that begins with Plato and is taken up by the moderns, and at the same time points to an understanding of causality in regard to the sublime that becomes covered over in later accounts. Consistent with Platonism, Longinus identifies the divine as an eternal being that lies beyond the world of beings. Longinus characterizes the experience of upliftment as the task of the rhetor who, through speech, brings his audience to an encounter with the beyond. Hemming emphasizes that the causal relationship involved in this upliftment is an inversion of the causal structure taken for granted in modern philosophy. For the divine is not disclosed as what has already always been, but rather:

[T]he rhetor, in bringing himself and his upliftment to LOGOS, to speaking, and so up to the threshold of the divine, finds the divine as that which is beyond and ahead of him and in the future…as what must be brought forth through speaking (58).

In addition, Hemming emphasizes that the relationship between speaker and audience in Longinus's account of the sublime makes upliftment not a private subjective experience, but a public and shared one, for it depends on the "shared exteriority of being in the world" (58).

In the following chapter, Hemming investigates the origins of the understanding of the divine presupposed by Longinus and taken up by the tradition. This understanding of the divine reflects what Heidegger calls "the cleft of being": the understanding of the divine as a stable being that lies wholly beyond the world of beings. This cleft in being, Hemming argues, is presupposed in the understanding of upliftment not only in modern, but also in postmodern philosophy: in the "reaching to the outermost heavens or the stepping back into an ideal innermost from which I step forth to enter the world" (59).

Hemming provides a careful reading of Parmenides in order to trace the origins of the cleft in being, a reading informed by that of Heidegger. This chapter will be old territory for those familiar with Heidegger's analysis of the same. In general, Hemming shows that Plato's account of being as that which stands opposed to non-being covers over a more authentic understanding of being, articulated in Parmenides, and leads to what Heidegger terms the metaphysics of presence. This shift introduces a new understanding of the divine as the source of value, for it leads to the "valuation of divinity to be the positing of the divine as highest, best, eternal and without death" (137). Hemming will ultimately show that this positing of God as highest value creates the possibility for the devaluation of God.

Before providing an account of the sublime in modernity, Hemming takes what he calls a necessary detour into the accounts of Aristotle and Aquinas in order to prepare the reader for what is to follow. The upshot of his investigation of these figures will be to show how their accounts of upliftment each mark a fundamental shift that prepares the way for the modern understanding of upliftment. For Aristotle, phantasia, a term often translated as imagination, takes on a central role in the experience of upliftment. The centrality of phantasia will be retained and yet transformed in modern accounts of the sublime and sets the stage for the primacy of the visual in the experience of upliftment. For Aristotle, upliftment is located in the activity of contemplation, wherein the soul "moves from being in some manner and potentially all things, to be in actuality all things" (94). The temporal structure of upliftment points to the future insofar as the soul seeks to return to an origin that is ahead of itself, as final cause. At the same time, what is encountered, being, is not characterized futurally, as it was in Parmenides, but as what has always been.

This understanding of the temporal structure of upliftment, as an encounter with what has already been, deepens once Aquinas reinterprets being and beings in terms of the relationship between creator and created. In Aquinas, God is no longer regarded as final cause but as efficient cause: God becomes an encounter with what is first in the chain of being. In addition, the cleft in being is reconfigured as a cleft between creature and creator, and neither senses nor thought can provide a passage to the divine. The break between creator and creature precludes the unity of soul and cosmos found in Aristotle, and sets the stage for the split between subject and object in modernity. Once the divine is reconfigured as efficient cause, upliftment is no longer a future task but rather "what was intended already to have been in the mind of God" (147). At this point, Hemming argues, God is understood in terms of the past, as first in a series of causes, and consequently, being is also understood in terms of the past: "now everything I encounter is already there because it was intended to be there by someone other than me, elsewhere"(149).

The central role of the imagination, the split between self and world, and the primacy of the past in the understanding of being continue in Descartes. God becomes not simply the first in a series of causes, but now lies at the beginning of time. In addition, the self becomes regarded as that which is already given prior to discovering itself in the world, and God "is then taken to be an already constituent aspect to this already existent self" (159). The world is no longer primarily known through the senses, and, Hemming notes, this has an impact on the temporal structure of being. The mathematical becomes the means by which things can be known, and thus what can be known about anything (the ideal mental realities of geometrical figure) can already be known in advance of the world of the senses. Even God himself is derived from an ideal mental reality: "the mathematical comes to predominate as the way in which things can appear: at the same time it predominates as a means of demonstrating the being of God"(172). Hemming concludes, "from Descartes onwards, up to Kant, the divinity of the sublime becomes not what is striven forward and up by the rhetor, but what is disclosed as already lying present, already there in advance of us" (176).

Hemming argues that Kant, like Descartes, privileges the mathematical in his understanding of God and world, which is why Kant privileges the mathematically sublime:

The mathematical is the distribution of the prefiguring 'cause' that God is in the being of every being: its precedent (invisible) type or idea makes its particular visibility possible, or rather makes it possible for us to recognize it as already having laid out as possible (182).

For Kant, upliftment takes place negatively: in the inability to represent what exceeds the capacities of the imagination, the subject becomes aware of the supersensible ideas of reason. Hemming interprets this experience in terms of the cleft in being: the Kantian experience of the sublime is a negation of beings which gives rise to a representation of the unrepresentable, namely being. Hence we find in Kant's account of the sublime, in continuation with Descartes, the primacy of subjectivity and the fundamental split between subject and object. Insofar as the sublime is experienced through an internal awareness of the supersensible, God is affirmed only through the interiority of the subject (183).

Hemming continues this genealogy of the sublime with the accounts of Hegel and Nietzsche, which Hemming regards as alternative developments of Kant's account of the sublime. In Hegel, the subject becomes absolutized and divinized in the unity of being, whereas in Nietzsche, the subject is shattered: both subject and substance are regarded as fictions produced out of the world of flux. Hemming argues that in Nietzsche, because the subject has become the source of divinity, the destruction of all stable structures, and thus of the subject, secures the death of God: "the death of God is to be proclaimed for the sake of undoing the stability of being for the sake of becoming"(204). With Nietzsche, the devaluation of God is complete.

Hemming concludes that contemporary theology stands at the impasse marked out by Hegel and Nietzsche:

Confronted on the one hand with the drive to ground knowledge as such, and on the other with the necessary contemporary experience of nihilism…theologians have been driven to force back into life the God declared on the one hand to be absolute subject by Hegel and on the other, by Nietzsche to be dead, which has turned out to be the constant drive to reproduce God through the will to power (207).

Thus, in tracing the genealogy of the sublime, Hemming has revealed how the postmodern understanding of the sublime represents a continuation of the modern understanding of upliftment. More specifically, the privileging of the subject over against an object, wherein the object must be negated in order to achieve the experience of upliftment, reflects modern presuppositions grounded in ontotheology. In addition, the positing of God as highest value sets the ground for the devaluation of God once his being is grounded in the subject himself. Having demonstrated the paucity of the postmodern understanding of upliftment, Hemming gestures towards an experience of transcending that captures an authentic method of encountering God, one that is freed of the ontotheological commitments of postmodernism. This alternative is found in the liturgy of the Church, which is "our being open out towards a 'wherein' from out of which the Spirit is poured: the future, the horizon of the end. It is from this surprising place that God steps forth to meet us" (244).

Postmodernity's Transcending is a highly ambitious and provocative work, and Hemming demonstrates impressive range and erudition in his analysis of both historical and contemporary figures. Hemming's investigations of temporality and causality in the figures he investigates are particularly insightful. However, it is Hemming's comprehensiveness that points to the weakness of this book. Because Hemming covers so much ground, he, at times, lacks a precision in his analysis.

For instance, in his first chapter, after describing post-modernism in terms of Lyotard's definition, Hemming takes Žižek's account of the sublime as his point of departure. Yet Žižek identifies his project as an alternative to precisely this interpretation of post-modernism. Later in the book, Hemming contrasts the account of the soul in Žižek and Aristotle (90), and it is unclear which aspect of Žižek's analysis of the human experience he is referring to, for Žižek has distinct notions of the subject and the self, neither of which maps on neatly to Aristotle's understanding of the soul. In Hemming's discussion of Hegel, he equates Hegel's notion of Aufhebung with the experience of upliftment and never discusses Hegel's extensive analysis of the sublime in his Lectures on Fine Art.

Hemming's analysis of the Kantian sublime is particularly questionable. Hemming equates the mathematical in the mathematically sublime with the geometrical in order to link the philosophies of Descartes and Kant insofar as both regard mathematics as the source of the intelligibility of experience (180). Yet in doing so, Hemming fails to recognize Kant's distinction between logical and aesthetic estimations of magnitude: mathematical determinations regard the former, whereas the latter is involved in the experience of the mathematically sublime. Moreover, the mathematical is not privileged as the source of the intelligibility of experience in Kant, but rather is, at best, one source of its intelligibility.

In addition, some of Hemming's arguments are too facile to convince. For instance, in a mere three pages, he condemns Derrida's negative theology for being steeped in ontotheology. He argues that Judith Butler's account of gender rests on Thomist ontotheological presuppositions regarding nature in a few pages as well. However, since these discussions are not central to Hemming's argument, their weakness does not necessarily compromise his central thesis. Indeed, despite the appreciable limitations of this work, Postmodernity's Transcending offers an original path for exploring how the understanding of transcendence reveals the temporal and causal structures of human experience.