Poststructuralism and Critical Theory's Second Generation

Placeholder book cover

Alan D. Schrift (ed.), Poststructuralism and Critical Theory's Second Generation, 466pp., vol. 6 of Alan D. Schrift (ed.), The History of Continental Philosophy (8 vols.), University of Chicago Press, 2010, 2700pp., $800.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226740461.

Reviewed by Antonio Calcagno, King's University College at The University of Western Ontario


Alan's Schrift's work, as scholar, philosopher and editor, is known for both its acuity and rigour. This volume of his The History of Continental Philosophy is yet another testament to Schrift's ability to gather leading scholars around an important theme, ultimately producing an excellent history of and guide to more recent developments in Continental philosophy. Volume 6: Poststructuralism and Critical Theory's Second Generation consists of 17 entries that commence with the reception of Nietzsche's thought into recent French philosophy and end with a discussion of Rorty among the Continentals, covering a period of Continental philosophy from about 1945 to 2007. The volume is also supplemented with a useful bibliography of major works relevant to the period as well as a chronology that simultaneously lists major philosophical, cultural and political events. This certainly helps situate thinkers, ideas and movements within the context of events in general but also within the broader developments in philosophy, including the Anglo-American and analytic traditions.

The volume opens with a preface by Schrift in which he explains the evolution of Continental philosophy. He notes,

"Continental Philosophy" itself is a contested concept. For some, it is understood to be any philosopher after 1780 originating on the European continent . . . . Such an understanding would make Georg von Wright or Rudolf Carnap . . . a "continental philosopher," an interpretation neither they nor their followers would easily accept. For others, "continental philosophy" refers to a style of philosophizing, one more attentive to the world of experience and less focused on a rigorous analysis of concepts or linguistic usage. (vii)

Rather than focus on a discussion of what constitutes Continental philosophy proper, Schrift maintains that one way to approach the question is to focus on the history of Continental philosophy, thereby avoiding nettling, polemical discussions between analytic and Continental philosophers. What we have, then, is the presentation of the content of a tradition broadly defined. This broad approach is both comprehensive and yields much food for thought about the particular philosophers discussed as well as the tradition as a whole, its past, present and future.

Schrift is not only the General Editor for the History but he also serves as the Editor of the poststructuralism volume. In total, there are eight volumes that constitute the whole History. In his Introduction to the present volume, Schrift sets the stage for poststructuralism, "French" Feminism and second-generation critical thinkers. Though he is mindful that poststructuralism has roots that go deeper than the turbulent years of the 1960s on the Continent, he begins with the theme of conflict and change that mark those years. Key in the development of poststructuralism in France was not only the death of philosophy as the master-discourse, mostly through the structuralists' engagements with the social sciences, but also the death of existentialism, which privileged subjectivity and consciousness. (5) Schrift identifies Foucault, Deleuze and Derrida as laying the groundwork for what would become dominant in the remainder of the twentieth century as Continental philosophy.

The first entry, "French Nietzscheanism," is also written by Schrift, and justly so, as he is a leading scholar of both Nietzsche and the reception of his work in twentieth-century French thought. Though the "French Nietzsche" is largely associated with later 1960s French thinkers, including Derrida, Foucault and Deleuze, Schrift's article notes that the reception of Nietzsche into French thinking predates the 1960s. He identifies three moments of Nietzschean thought in France. The first moment was not located in philosophy. He was read largely outside the Academy and it was Henri Lichtenberger (20) who first taught a course on Nietzsche, but in a German Literature Department. Early works on Nietzsche appeared, including those of Lichtenberger and Andler, but literature professors rather than philosophers wrote these tomes. As philosophy at the French universities began to make the strong distinction between professional, scientific philosophy and literature, Nietzsche continued to be marginalised in philosophy.

Schrift identifies the second important moment of reception as marked by the work of Bataille, Klossowski, Wahl and Lefebvre, who all had a huge influence in sociological circles. Nietzsche continued to be ignored in philosophy through the 40s and 50s, but it was in the 1960s, when French thinkers like Derrida, Foucault and Deleuze began to read closely the work of thinkers like Bataille, that the third and most powerful moment of French Nietzscheanism took root: Nietzsche returns to philosophy. Nietzschean themes run through these three eminent philosophers, including those of genealogy, power, the impotence of reason, etc., and Schrift nicely identifies the relevant connections. He remarks,

"French Nietzscheanism" refers to more than the production of an enormous amount of French philosophical scholarship on Nietzsche, however, and to discuss "French Nietzscheanism" in its third moment is, I would argue, to go to the heart of poststructuralist philosophy because in many ways it was in their appropriation of Nietzschean themes that the dominant poststructuralist philosophers -- Foucault, Deleuze, Derrida -- distinguished themselves both from the structuralists who preceded them and from the more traditional philosophical establishment in France, whose authority they sought to challenge. (29)

The second article is on Louis Althusser and is written by Warren Montag. This essay beautifully and poignantly makes the case that the impression of Althusser as a "structural Marxist" is dated and, therefore, no longer sustainable. Also untenable is the view that interest in Althusser is connected more with the murder of his wife and his plea of insanity than with his philosophical corpus. (44)

Not only has an entirely new Althusser come to light, but the publication, above all, of his "late" writings -- those written after 1980 -- on what he called "aleatory materialism" or "the materialism of the encounter," has succeeded in calling into question the meaning of Althusser's work as a whole. (47-48)

Montag notes that we now possess lecture notes on Hobbes, Locke and Rousseau, which helped form the substance of Althusser's "ideological interpellation." (48) By focusing on the themes of the subject, structure and the origin (end), Montag captures key elements that typify Althusser's thought as a whole, especially as it develops from Althusser's early period to his later work, which has largely gone unnoticed.

Timothy O'Leary's chapter on Michel Foucault chronicles the development of Foucault's thought from its earliest stages to its development at the Collège de France. Themes covered by O'Leary's articles include Foucault's writings on the following: madness and society, the contingency of knowledge, politics, modern power, sex, sexuality and the body, from power to biopower, ethics and self-conduct, subjects and truth. O'Leary certainly captures and describes succinctly the essence of Foucault's long and rich philosophical trajectory. His discussion of the classification of Foucault's work is interesting, given that it crosses so many disciplines and covers so many areas. (68) Despite this seemingly disparate image of Foucault, O'Leary does make the argument that there is consistency in Foucault's corpus as themes that were developed earlier reappear throughout his work: knowledge, power and the self. (69)

Well-known Deleuze translator and scholar Daniel W. Smith's entry on Deleuze succinctly presents the work of the philosopher. He chronicles not only Deleuze's work on major figures in the history of philosophy, including Spinoza, Kant, Bergson and Leibniz, but he also discusses Deleuze and Guattari's own philosophical interventions. Smith focuses on what he calls dialectics or the theory of the idea in order to discuss Deleuze's Difference and Repetition. He then focuses on Deleuze's aesthetic theory or theory of sensation by discussing Deleuze's engagement with the work of the painter Francis Bacon, cinema and the philosophy of Leibniz. A discussion of Deleuze's ethics or theory of affectivity follows and examines the philosopher's writings on Nietzsche and Kant.

The penultimate section concentrates on Deleuze’s politics and critiques of capitalism, especially as they are developed with Guattari in their co-authored works Anti Oedipus and Thousand Plateaus. The chapter ends with a discussion of Deleuze's treatment of the concept, which consists of three major components: endo-consistency, exo-consistency, and self-referentiality. In a time when philosophy is under attack as a legitimate university discipline, as witnessed by the growing closure of departments of philosophy, Smith reminds us, through Deleuze, that philosophy is its own discipline: "More than most of his contemporaries, Deleuze insisted on the autonomy of philosophy as a discipline, arguing forcefully for the irreducibility of philosophical concepts to scientific functions or logical propositions." (108)

The next entry in the History is on Derrida. Samir Haddad rightly acknowledges both the complexity and controversy that surround the inclusion of Derrida within philosophy. Considered by analytic philosophers more whimsical and literary than philosophical, even nonsensical, and considered to be more self-fashioning than strictly philosophical by thinkers like Rorty, Derrida's long and prolific career along with his vast corpus continue to challenge the very definition of philosophy while also challenging all disciplines to examine closely what it is they claim to be practicing and investigating. The chapter opens with a biography of Derrida and his migration to France and the ENS in Paris. Haddad then turns to the meteoric rise of Derrida within North American literary criticism circles at universities like Yale and Johns Hopkins. Between 1962 and 1972, Derrida produced five significant texts: a translation and commentary on Husserl's Origin of Geometry, Speech and Phenomena, Of Grammatology, Margins of Philosophy and Writing and Difference. (114) This early period marks the birth of Derridean deconstruction, a term that Derrida was never quite happy with, especially in its North American reception.

The third period of Derrida's career, from 1973-2003, was never as prolific as his early period, and this is the period in which Derrida began to comment on and give readings of various texts by authors including Hegel (Glas), Freud and Lacan (The Post Card), and Marx (Specters of Marx). Many of these texts, and I have only named a few, could be seen as Derrida practicing his deconstruction. It is also within this period that we get a more explicitly political Derrida, the thinker who engages various questions concerning the sans-papiers, university education, democracy, forgiveness, political friendship, etc. The final period, which Haddad simply calls "Legacy," ponders the Derridean legacy as whole. He notes that Derrida's impact within French academic philosophy as well as Anglo-American philosophy has been minimal, but that he continues to have a strong influence within North American Continental philosophy circles and disciplines outside philosophy.

Particularly exciting are the next three entries on Jean-François Lyotard, Pierre Bourdieu and Michel Serres. These three thinkers are today largely seen to be marginal and it is commonplace to forget their impact both on the social and natural sciences. Writings on their work appear less and less, but this does not mean that these figures were not and do not continue to be relevant for understanding the history of Continental philosophy as well as its future. James Williams' piece on Lyotard begins by reminding readers that Lyotard was one of the great essayists of the twentieth century and that he wrote on a vast variety of subjects. Williams discusses the Lyotard’s analysis and views of: modernism and postmodernism, resistance in art and philosophy, narrative and the unconscious, exclusion and justice, time and the limits of knowledge, affects and matter, politics and aesthetics. It was Lyotard who helped the social sciences, as well as philosophy, articulate the postmodern critique of modernity, which included the death of grand narratives, claims to absolute universality and necessity. It was Lyotard who introduced a vibrant sense of language-games and the differend.

Derek Robbins's essay, "Pierre Bourdieu and the Practice of Philosophy," discusses the development of Bourdieu's thought and its impact on sociology and other social sciences. The relation between sociology and philosophy is one of the key structuring themes of the essay, and Robbins employs it to discuss Bourdieu's intellectual engagements with psychoanalysis, Leibniz, phenomenology, Marxism, and other various topics. The author highlights the importance of practice, especially action and habit, for Bourdieu's thought; practice structures who and what we are, whether university student, farmer, worker, or scientist. Bourdieu reminds us that the practice of philosophy is more than just the pursuit of certain truths and ideals; it is embedded with certain social and political contexts that ultimately colour the products and goals of philosophy itself, as in the case of Martin Heidegger and his Nazism.

David F. Bell's essay on Michel Serres makes accessible in a very engaging manner the complex and seemingly disparate work of Michel Serres. Undoubtedly one of the most enigmatic and difficult philosophers of the twentieth century, Serres, Bell emphasizes, reads science and the philosophy of science in unorthodox ways, challenging the very status and structure of the sciences and what they purport to study and discover. Bell examines the key and eclectic works of Serres, including Le système de Leibniz, Le parasite, Hermès and Le contrat naturel. There is a fruitful discussion of Serres' engagement with ancient materialism, including that of Lucretius.

Christopher F. Zurn's detailed account of Habermas is most informative. He traces Habermas' rise through the Frankfurt School and the changes within Habermas' own philosophy. The chapter follows the periods of development of Habermas' philosophy: present-oriented philosophy of history; epistemology via philosophical anthropology; theory of communicative action; the discourse theory of morality; systematic philosophical consolidation. The entry focuses on the "context of the debates" (including Habermas' critiques of phenomenology, the debates around language, modern and postmodern philosophy) that has shaped his philosophy. The chapter also traces themes that are consistent within Habermas' oeuvre, including

a focus on communication as the immanent locus of the transcendental, an insistence on the achievements of reason without ignoring the ravages of modernity's one-sided employment of reason, and a conception of philosophy as critical theory, that is, as reflective interdisciplinary theory oriented toward human autonomy. (197-198)

One of the striking features of this essay is the discussion of Habermas' incredibly broad range of interlocutors, which ultimately assists readers in understanding the finer contours of Habermas' thinking.

Schrift appropriately places the next entry, James Swindal's "Second Generation Critical Theory" right after the entry on Habermas. In an earlier volume of the History, earlier critical theorists like Adorno and Horkheimer are treated. The treatment of the second-generation critical theorists brings readers up to the present by investigating the thought of theorists like Karl-Otto Apel, Albrecht Wellmer, Oskar Negt and Claus Offe. Swindal briefly mentions the work of Michael Theunissen as well as that of Ernst Tugendhat as being closely influenced by second-generation critical theorists. Swindal notes that with the onset of the 1970's the second generation of critical theorists began to expand geographically as well as to cover broader topics. There is a more explicit engagement with pragmatic theories of truth and communication (Peirce, for example) as well as a discussion of the welfare state and the risk society. The discussion of Apel's contribution could be augmented and, given the preceding discussion of Habermas, one would like to see less reference to Habermas' and Adorno's ideas in this chapter and more of a sustained focus on what is proper and original to these second-generation thinkers. For example, what is it that precisely marks second-generation aesthetic theory as different and more critical than, say, Adorno's theory or more contemporary aesthetic theory?

Wayne J. Froman's entry, "Gadamer, Ricoeur and the Legacy of Phenomenology," is well executed. This chapter was a challenge to write, I am sure. First, Froman had to connect two very rich and often disparate thinkers. Second, one wonders whether both phenomenology and hermeneutics are keys comprehensive enough to contextualise the thought of both thinkers. The task is made even more difficult in that both philosophers lived a long time and had prolific careers. Perhaps separate chapters would have been more useful here, thereby allowing each philosopher to receive his own treatment, thereby relieving the demanding burden imposed upon the author of the entry as well as showing the broader developments of both thinkers' thought. In the end, Froman does successfully show through both Gadamer and Ricoeur the impact that hermeneutics had as a specific development within the history of Continental philosophy.

Chapters 12 and 13 depart from the more traditional method of focusing on Continental philosophers proper. The former chapter, written by Claire Colebrook, examines the history of the linguistic turn in Continental philosophy, from Husserl and Heidegger to Derrida, Deleuze and Guattari. Colebrook rightly notes that the central place of language in both analytic and Continental philosophy throughout the twentieth century provided much room for the intersection of the two traditions. She chronicles the impact of thinkers like Wittgenstein, Searle and Austin on Continental philosophy. The latter chapter, written by Rosi Braidotti and Schrift, traces the development and impact of psychoanalysis on Continental philosophy. They also discuss desire within this psychoanalytic framework, from the Hegelian legacy in thinkers like Kojève, Bataille and Blanchot to desire in feminist thought. They also bring to the fore the impact of Lacan's development of the master signifier with respect to the thought of Derrida. It would have been interesting if the chapter also briefly touched upon more recent developments in psychoanalysis and their potential for contemporary Continental philosophy. I refer here to the work of people like Winnicott, Laplanche, Green and Aulagnier.

Chapters 14 and 15 are devoted to four eminent women philosophers who have significantly shaped the trajectory of Continental philosophy. Mary Beth Mader's entry on Luce Irigaray demonstrates both the complexity and rich evolution of Irigaray's philosophy. Mader shows how Irigaray, while famous for her feminist thinking and for her writings on sex and gender, is, especially in her later thought, also concerned with questions of alterity, love and the divine. She traces Irigaray's critique of the history of Western philosophy and sexual identity, as well as her engagement with the thought of Lévi-Strauss and anthropology and psychoanalysis. The chapter ends with a brief description of Irigaray's more recent work on love, poetry and ecology and ecofeminism.

The next chapter, Sara Heinäma's "Cixous, Kristeva, and Le Doeuff: Three 'French Feminists,'" begins by noting that

The concept of French feminism emerged in the USA and Britain in the 1970s when selections of the works of French theoreticians were translated into English. The writers included in this category are all feminists in the sense that they work to question traditional misogynistic conceptions of femininity and masculinity, women and men. They operate, however, with different theoretical and practical interests and within different disciplines: philosophy, psychoanalysis, linguistics and semiotics, literature and history. (359)

Heinäma also notes that, although all these women write in French, this does not mean that they were all born in France. The name "French Feminists," then, is a misnomer. Though Cixous, Kristeva and Le Doeuff are the main focus of her attention, the author does note the importance of Wittig, Kofman and Clément. (360) The entry proceeds thematically rather than focusing on each individual author. Themes discussed include: embodiment, maternity and desire, subjectivity and exclusion, and the imaginary of Western philosophy. Noteworthy is Heinäma's attention to various figures and ideas within the history of philosophy and how these feminist thinkers came to interpret, reject and even rework certain ideas, thereby making an important contribution to the history of Continental philosophy.

The penultimate chapter of the History is written by Jeffrey T. Nealon and concentrates on "Deconstruction and the Yale School of Literary Theory." One would think that to topic of this chapter could have been easily discussed in the chapter on Derrida. Certainly, Derrida's impact on literary criticism and theory was definitely chronicled and noted in that chapter. But I feel the editor was very wise in devoting a separate chapter to the Yale School of Deconstruction, which includes the work of thinkers like Harold Bloom, Paul de Man, Geoffrey Hartman and J. Hillis Miller.  It was, in large part, through the practice and readings of deconstruction that three important contemporary fields of inquiry and research were launched: postcolonial studies, cultural studies, and theory and criticism, which includes robust theories of reading, literature and critique. One cannot underestimate the impact of the work of Derridean-inspired thinker Gayatri Spivak on postcolonial thinking and subaltern studies.

The final chapter of the History is written by David R. Hiley and examines the work of Rorty and his ties to Continental philosophy. Here, I am unsure as to whether this discussion should be a separate chapter or be included in other sections, especially the treatment of Derrida and deconstruction. Rorty is famous, of course, for turning his back on analytic philosophy. Though he studied Heidegger and engaged Derrida's ideas, , Rorty was also critical of Continental philosophy. Though the chapter is right to note Rorty's impact, especially on the relationship between pragmatism and deconstruction, it seems that Rorty comes out more as an independent thinker, pursuing philosophy his own way; he draws upon the whole tradition of philosophy while not being afraid to cross perceived divides in academic philosophy.

All in all, Schrift's Poststructuralism and Critical Theory's Second Generation is both comprehensive and detailed while being accessible to a broad readership, from the generalist interested in basic ideas and facts to the specialist, who may require new perspectives on and approaches to specific thinkers and movements. This work is not only a history; it also opens up future possibilities, showing emerging trends in contemporary Continental philosophy. The volume nicely sets the stage for the next volumes edited by Braidotti and byTodd May, After Poststructuralism: Transitions and Transformations and Emerging Trends in Continental Philosophy, volumes 7 and 8, respectively, of the History.