Power and Influence: The Metaphysics of Reductive Explanation

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Richard Corry, Power and Influence: The Metaphysics of Reductive Explanation, Oxford University Press, 2019, 240pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198840718.

Reviewed by Kristina Engelhard, Technische Universität Dortmund


Power and Influence is a strong contribution to the debate on dispositions and causal powers in metaphysics of science after its decline in the last few years following serious attacks. Corry strongly revitalises the field by suggesting a richer ontology, supplying a deeper analysis of the structure of dispositional properties, arguing for this account in a methodologically very well reflected way and displaying the powers' explanatory power in so many details. His ontology assumes a tripartite structure: powers, influences, and outcome states. This structure is novel in its assumption that influences form a distinct element. Corry uses the reductive method, which can roughly be understood as explaining the behaviour of a complex system by describing the behaviour of its parts in isolation, as his factive basis. A central precondition of the reductive method is that the behaviours of the system's elements are invariant across different contexts. Corry argues entities that guarantee this invariance are powers or their influences.

Corry's book is probably the most important volume on dispositions since Alexander Bird's Nature's Metaphysics: Laws and Properties (2007). His new theory's methodology and content is extraordinarily well-thought through. His showing how the account promotes solutions to general questions in metaphysics and ethics, rather than criticising competing theories, is particularly valuable.

The first three chapters supply a transcendental argument for the existence of causal influences by showing that they "are necessary presuppositions of one of the most useful and successful [and I might suggest essential) methods we have for understanding the world" (p. 42). This very strong claim is relativized a few lines later. However, Corry can make a claim on supplying an inference to the best explanation; probably metaphysics can't demand to show more if we understand it as an inductive enterprise. Corry gives an argument for his move from method to ontology: "The success of the reductive method in such diverse fields suggests that the method really has latched onto a substantive fact about the way the world is structured" (p. 3). As convincing as his arguments for this move are, there is some doubt whether they apply to all parts of his theory.

Corry's central argument isn't entirely new. Similar arguments for dispositions forming a fundamental category were proposed by Andreas Hüttemann and discussed by Bernard Williams. Hüttemann also starts his argument with our practice of explaining the behaviour of complex systems. But these approaches weren't elaborated in such detail.

The book's structure is tripartite: Corry first argues for the existence of influences by abduction and inference to the best explanation, next deals with the explicative structure in more detail and, finally, shows his account's explanatory power.

In the introduction Corry presents the reductive method as extremely useful and widely used not only in the sciences but also in everyday life. In chapter 2 he analyses the structure of reductive explanations, making clear that he isn't concerned with theory reduction but with local, explanatory reduction, i.e. reductions the relata of which can be "fragments of a theory, generalisations of varying scope, or even particular facts" (p. 8). He is particularly interested in reductive explanations of complex systems in biology and the social sciences. Corry's argument begins with the definition of reductive explanations which rests on definitions of basic objects, systems and subsystems. In chapter 3 he emphasises the metaphysical presuppositions of the reductive method. The first presupposition is that the parts of complex systems are equipped with something that guarantees for invariance, something remaining constant between their behaviour in isolation and their behaviour in non-isolated conditions. Otherwise the behaviour of parts in isolation would be irrelevant for their behaviour in non-isolated conditions.

Corry then discusses four candidates for supplying the invariance: behaviours, laws, Humean and non-Humean dispositions. He argues Corry’s argument against behaviours as suppliers of invariance, using counter-examples from physics and biology. He holds that laws also can't be the suppliers because they describe the behaviour of the parts in isolation, but don't tell us how the parts behave in non-isolated or less than ideal conditions. Referring to "super-laws" (complex laws from simpler laws) doesn't solve the problem since they, too, reduce the conditions in which they hold properly so the same problem arises. Humean Dispositions can't be suppliers since they supervene on the categorical properties and the laws. Consequently, the problems laws have reappear. It is worth noting that no previous dispositionalist succeeded in getting rid of categoricalism that easily!

Corry then uses the same procedure when discussing two non-Humean types of dispositionalism: dispositional essentialism (Ellis/Lierse), and the capacities-account (Cartwright). He shows that both fail in supplying the desired invariance. The dispositional-essentialist's dispositions can't supply the invariance in question either because the dispositions' essences are also defined by their manifestations in isolated conditions. Hence they contain no hint as to how the dispositions behave in less than ideal conditions. Allowing for multi-track dispositions isn't a way out of the problem because replacing a simple conditional by a more complex conditional adding further behaviours of the disposition P as B, B', B'' relative to conditions C, C', C'' etc. adds variety but not invariance. The same problem holds for the capacities' account, which takes the capacities to be dispositions as determinables or as highly generic.

Chapter 4 is a central one. Corry investigates the invariance guaranteeing structure in more detail, and makes many important decisions for everything else. He subscribes to the view that causal powers are a kind of disposition, associating his account with those of Molnar, Mumford/Anjum, Harré, Ellis/Lierse, and Bird. Unlike them, he holds that causal powers are dispositions to exert influences. He begins with a brief introduction to dispositionalism, referring to the simple conditional analysis as a "rough and ready handle on the modality philosophers believe is characteristic of dispositionality" (p. 45).

He next discusses Mumford/Anjum's dispositionalist vector model of causation in which the vectors represent contributions as manifestations of dispositions to an overall effect. This contribution model of dispositions is associated with their view of an irreducible dispositional modality. Corry takes it to illustrate how he understands his influences. Contributions, it seems at first, are a kind of influence. However, things turn out to be more complex:

If a power is a disposition to exert an influence then the manifestation of a power is not typically a change in some property, but rather, the existence of a causal influence that makes a contribution to such a change. . . . The general picture is then as follows: the state of a system triggers various powers, these active powers exert influences, and the influences then combine to produce a change in the state of a system. (p. 48f.)

Corry thinks influences can be forces, such that powers and forces somehow come apart. He addresses a worry McKitrick raised about the contribution model of dispositions and that can be reformulated for his influences: what kind of thing are they? McKitrick argues that contributions can't be intermediate events, part or property of the effect or force, so the last option is threatened with regress. Corry thinks, however, that his account allows him to assume the last option, because he differentiates between powers and forces and between the input to a power and the modality that governs it and the output of a power and its associated modality. On this basis he argues: "Powers are essentially dispositional and thus involve a modality that is characterized by something like SCA. Influences on the other hand, are characterized by the distinct, though similarly named 'dispositional modality'." (p. 51) The first is his input modality, the second his output modality. Corry prefers to use "influence modality" rather than "dispositional modality". Doing this, he thinks, avoids the regress.

Corry then goes deeper into the structure. First he gives four definitions of powers, a contextualisation of powers, what he calls standard dispositions and standard powers as a simple conditional analysis. He argues that they are not threatened by antidotes, finks and mimics. An important move in his account of dispositions is to defend the thesis that powers can be multi-track with respect to their manifestations. The issue is important because some dispositionalists defend their view by claiming to have a superior metaphysics of laws of nature at their disposal. According to this view the laws of nature are descriptions of the behaviour of objects under certain conditions due to dispositional properties. Corry's example of a disposition that may enter such a law is electric charge. If electric charge would be a single track-disposition, a single conditional would have to be enough to characterize the behaviour it gives rise to -- described by Coulomb's law. But this is not the case. It gives rise to infinitely many behaviours depending on the values of the conditions the relevant law includes. Hence electric charge would have to be described by the conjunction of infinitely many conditionals. If we take each conditional to determine a single disposition, then Coulomb's law would describe the behaviour of infinitely many dispositions. But then the issue is by which this bundle of infinitely many dispositions is held together? Accepting multi-track dispositions avoids these problems. But it requires explaining how the infinitely many behaviours can belong to a single property but not many.

Corry's solution is modelling dispositions as functions: "powers can be represented as influence-valued functions on the domain of possible stimuli." (p. 58). The rationale behind this is: "A representation of a multi-track disposition in terms of a single function . . . reinforces the idea that the disposition is a single property." (p. 59). The "domain of the function representing the power must include the entire state-space (the abstract space of all possible states) of the 'system' that is relevant to the power." (p. 60). Corry further specifies what is relevant for the power. His idea is that it only takes a minimal state space: in his example: electric charge can be characterized by a function the domain of which is only a two-particle system.

Since we are concerned with the grounding metaphysics of methodology: how does this "representation" translate into metaphysics? What are dispositions like, if they should be represented thus? Do we get an answer? Here again methodological concerns arise regarding the step from methodology to metaphysics. In this chapter it becomes clear what consequences follow from Corry's methodology, which some readers may find irritating: His theorizing here is very thetic. Although he presents good arguments for his decisions in detail, the informed reader knows that there are abysses of problems behind them, which have sometimes led to a standstill in the debate. Thanks to his inductive methodology, Corry can avoid this standstill by being entitled in principle to develop a model whose truth is ultimately measured only by how it performs overall as an explanation of the success of the reductive method. In this way, he can simply cut off fruitless isolated debates -- this comes as a relief. Nevertheless, there are legitimate concerns as to whether his theory is ultimately consistent. I will come back to this issue later. Corry argues that the relation between powers and their influences is a relation between determinables and determinates. Although his method allows for some black-boxing more investigation of the internal structure of powers and their influences would be desirable.

In chapter 5 Corry explicates his account using more formal language. He begins by distinguishing the four steps used by the reductive method. The first is breaking the complex system up into its basic components. Corry here deals with the conditions that the components must fulfil in order to make a reductive explanation possible. The second step consists in identifying the relevant powers and their associated subsystems. In both steps it is relevant that the component objects and powers are relatively basic, i.e. basic with respect to the explanation of the complex system. It is however important that powers as well as the influences that they manifest can be resultant powers or resultant influences. The "combination of two influences that are directed to a change in the same property of a single object is itself an influence" (p. 74). Those resultant influences define what Corry terms the "rank" of a power, such that a third-rank power manifests in resultant influence from three component influences. The ranks are relative to the system to be explained. The third step consists in calculating the basic influences. The idea is to figure out which pairs of powers contribute to the behaviour of the overall system to be explained and hence which resultant influences have to be taken into account. The fourth step consists in the composition of the basic influences. Here Corry differentiates an algebraic formalism which basically introduces the binary operator Å which allows to combine influences u and v such that u Å v = r. Corry explicates a number of conditions that the formalism for combining the powers and their manifestations have to fulfil in order to make reductive explanations possible. He leaves open the question of how the formal operator translates into metaphysics, i.e. which metaphysical entity, relation or what have you, it might stand for. Yet again the question arises: Is Corry concerned with the true structure of the world or is it a descriptive level for explanatory purposes on a pragmatic level only? Interestingly, he concedes that any reductive explanation can deliver a function that maps states of the system directly onto the observable outcome behaviour without referring to the component influences. However, he convincingly emphasizes that the strength of the reductive method lies precisely in the fact that it presents the behaviour of complex systems as a result of the behaviour of subsystems, which is invariant in other constellations, so that the subsystems can be recombined and thus function in other explanations. This is possible, however, only if influences are integrated with the ontological framework.

In chapter 6 Corry argues that there are also macroscopic powers that exist in their own right on top of the basic and fundamental powers and clarifies the relation between composite powers and their components. This is important because the reductive method applies not only on the fundamental level in fundamental physics, but also on higher levels. Composite powers in the first place are powers of the same type that each exert an influence on some object. According to Corry the earth's gravitational power is a composite power because it consists of numerous particles that each have gravitational power which all together make up the earth's gravitational power. What is composed in the first place are the influences, Corry explicitly stresses. His thesis then is that "In general, the joint existence of component forces acting on an object will instantiate the resultant force. Resultant forces, then, are related to component forces as functional type to realizer, and this is just a variety of the determinable/determinate relation." (p. 102). He responds to several issues that arise from his account (the problem of null forces, i.e. forces that jointly amount to null, or the problem of overdetermination) and also deals with Bird's arguments against the existence of macro-powers.

In chapter 7 Corry uses the conclusions he reached to answer the question of what grounds the laws of nature. He basically subscribes to Bird's dispositional essentialist view that the dispositional essences of things ground the laws of nature, understood as universal generalisations. He also agrees that there are basic powers, unfinkable and unantidotable dispositions on the fundamental level, "basic powers" in Corry's terms (if there is a fundamental level) and that those necessitate their outcomes. This necessitarian conviction reappears in chapter 8 in the thesis that causation is a kind of necessitation. Corry shows that Bird's view on dispositional properties is insufficient to enable the derivation from law statements to dispositional essences. Corry's causal influences have to be plugged into the picture to allow for Bird's account on laws. But Corry thinks that we have to differentiate between the laws of influence and the laws of composition. The laws of influence can be directly grounded in the causal influences that bring about the changes in nature whereas the laws of composition have to be "grounded in the essential natures of the influences to which these laws apply" (p. 130).

In chapter 8 he clarifies his use of causal notions. This is particularly interesting since Corry's arguments are based on a very well-developed methodology although his methodological considerations also leave many unanswered questions. His methodological diagnosis concerning the metaphysics of causation is that we can't give a conceptual analysis or a naturalised metaphysical account of causation because causation is a multifaceted concept that does not allow for a unified analysis, and the metaphysics of causation can't be read off our best scientific theories either. The result of his discussion might be understood as a modified Canberra-Plan method: "if we are interested in the objective nature of the world we should not look for objective relations of cause and effect, but rather look for objective features of the world that underlie our causal judgements." (p. 143). After also discussing the most important accounts of causation from a methodological standpoint, Corry's thesis is that "true causal claims are all made true by the existence of appropriate causal influences and causal powers." (p. 145). Nevertheless, he orders causal claims into two different groups: causation as production and causation as dependence. The truthmakers of causal claims in both groups are causal influences. Corry shows that causal influences share four essential features with productive causation, which allows him to take influences as the ontological basis for causal claims that belong in this group. He then shows in detail how the ontology of influences allows us to explain these features.

Chapter 9 is a central one because Corry presents another argument for his theory of causal influences: he tries to show that his theory better allows us to construct models for causal processes than structural causal models (SCMs). An advantage of causal influence models (CIMs) is that they are actually modular, i.e. complex models can be extended by simply adding modules of causal influences. This is also because CIMs depict the real structure of complex systems' behaviours since they get the correct number of mechanisms at work. While SCMs discriminate each factor that makes a difference to the overall outcome it does not arrange them by how they actually work together in the mechanisms involved. The causal influence graph shows which causal influences work together in being directed to the overall outcome. But at this point doubts arise: Corry's claim is to find ontological preconditions of the reductive method, i.e. to draw conclusions from a methodology as to what the real world is like. But are the real processes really structured in the way they are represented in Corry's CIMs? The n-body problem of physics indicates that at least causal forces of gravitation actually interact, i.e. that the addition of another module changes the value of a seemingly independent variable. The solutions of the n-body problems in mechanics and in relativity-theory show that simple modular addition is probably not the right model for cases like these. I think that a causal influence theory might be able to accommodate cases like these also.

Chapter 10 develops another strong point of Corry's account. He is able to show that his theory of causal influences even explains cases in which the reductive method fails for metaphysical reasons. One prominent case is emergent properties. He can show how applying his model on Kim's so-called direct argument against the causal efficacy of emergent properties makes this objection ineffective; in Corry's picture the causings go on at a different level than in Kim's. Corry works out several ways reductive explanations can fail, explains how they violate his assumptions of reductive explanation, and shows how they relate to the influence-model of powers.

In his last, brief chapter, Corry opens a completely new window. He sketches how the metaphysics of influences can be used to introduce a new ethical theory. He dubs it "influentialism"; it says that "we should evaluate an action based on the influences that the action contributes" (p. 220). An important ethical intuition that influentialism captures in the right way is that "we all need to do our bit to contribute to the best outcome, even if our individual contributions make little difference to the outcome" (p. 223). He discusses cases which pose problems for consequentialism and shows that influentialism copes well with them. Corry convincingly argues that influentialism also captures intuitions that guide deontology, but with which it also struggles: that the ethical value of an action should not be measured by its consequences, because too many disturbing factors influence natural processes that are outside our sphere of influence, but that the success of an action should still play a role. Hence Corry thinks that influentialism strikes a middle ground between consequentialism and deontology.

That there are points for which Corry doesn't provide an explicit answer shouldn't undercut the recognition his book deserves. It would be very interesting and helpful to know how his approach relates to those discussed in recent years (the powerful qualities view, defended by, e.g., Jacobs and Tugby; or the identity theory, introduced by Martin and Heil) and how he would defend himself against the objections that have been formulated against dispositionalism lately.

These objections raise some concerns about his book. First, necessitation is an important feature for which Corry's influences-ontology has to account. The problem of dispositional necessitation is linked to the dispositionalist version of the inference problem. Dispensational theories have yet to find a satisfactory answer. And it is not really clear how the accounts by Vetter and Borghini/Williams relate to this problem. It isn't clear to me how Corry can explain the necessitating power of his powers. Like Bird he stipulates that powers necessitate their outcomes, but doesn't show how the influences necessitate the changes they are supposed to bring about. This is even more problematic for his account because the issue arises not only for the manifestations of the powers and the changes that come about but also for the relation between the causal powers and their influences. Corry offers an account of how their relation is to be understood (as the relation between determinable and determinate), but it is not clear to me that this relation is suitable to give the right kind of necessitation needed in a power's ontology. It is not clear by which feature and how the influences can do what they're supposed to do.

Perhaps debate about Corry's book will promote answers to these questions.