Power and Technology: A Philosophical and Ethical Analysis

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Faridun Sattarov, Power and Technology: A Philosophical and Ethical Analysis, Rowman and Littlefield, 2019, 198pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781786611291.

Reviewed by Barry Allen, McMaster University


The notion of technological power has become an object of attention in both academic and policy circles. Several different concepts of power are in play in these discourses, demonstrating the need for a cross-disciplinary, integrative framework to identify and clarify different ideas about the relation between technology and power. This book aims to provide such a framework for understanding the exercise of power by and through technology, and to do so by bridging social and political theory, critical studies in technology, philosophy, and ethics. These words, paraphrased from Faridun Sattarov's own summary, describe the aspiration of his book. They sound fine. Sadly, the execution consistently disappoints the interest this summary description appropriately provokes.

Sattarov advocates a pluralist approach to the concept of power. The idea of power has been analyzed in several ways. These should not be viewed as competitors for the uniquely correct analysis. It is dogmatic to assume one analysis is correct, and each of those he canvasses accentuate sides of a complex phenomenon.

Sattarov offers a summary discussion of ideas of power from Weber to Foucault, drawing widely from the social sciences, critical theory, and political philosophy. He distinguishes episodic "power over," and dispositional "power to." For instance, literacy is a dispositional power. I can read even when I am asleep, or when I actually read a book, "which," he explains, "is an artefact consisting of a set of written or printed pages fastened together in one place and enclosed between softer or harder protective covers."

Sattarov thinks that the dispositional power of people to bring about morally or socially significant outcomes is radically different from the dispositional power of a thing. People remain responsible in a way things are not. Yet he recognizes a consequence of living in "an increasingly technological age," is that it becomes difficult clearly to differentiate what people do or can do and what their devices do or can do. He therefore introduces the systemic power of networks and institutions, and a constitutive power that creates both the conditions necessary for action and the actors themselves. He has Foucault in mind. Intentions are demoted; unintentional outcomes count as fully-fledged exercises of power.

In Part One, the first five of nine chapters, and more than half of the book, Sattarov has nothing to say beyond paraphrases of his research literature, and a blizzard of distinctions. For instance, despite several long pages paraphrasing Foucault's argument in Discipline and Punish, no one who has read Foucault's book will encounter anything that is not completely obvious. The chapters of Part Two are less dull, though the discussion is still almost entirely a paraphrase of the research literature. This is not entirely without value, for instance, to those to whom some part of this literature is new and who are looking for tips about what to read.

Chapter 6 is about the ethics of algorithms. "Just like people, algorithms can become powerful and prejudiced." Sattarov complains that despite a growing literature not enough attention is paid to distinctions. How many senses of power? How many senses of algorithm, how many senses of bias? This is his idea of "analytical rigour."

Sattarov introduces readers to problems arising from the use of web-based algorithms to affect users' behavior. The primary mode of algorithmic power is to exclude. Algorithmic determinations of creditworthiness easily replicate social prejudices, excluding or disadvantaging those who do not fit the profile. Algorithm in hiring decisions can introduce invisible bias in the selection and representation of information. Yet he decides reassuringly that algorithms are not autonomous powers in the world, but are rather a prominent technology used by rational agents to acquire or enlarge power.

Chapters 7 and 8 are about Power and Ethics, canvassing conceptual connections before taking up questions of implementation. The ethical concepts he discusses are responsibility, vulnerability, authenticity, and trust. He advances the unsurprising argument that one or another way, power makes problems for each of these ethical values. He describes current models of governance in science and technology designed to address the aporias of power in new technologies. He mentions Value-Sensitive Design, Disclosive Computer Ethics, and an EU paradigm of Responsible Research and Innovation.

Traditional requisites of effectiveness, quality, and safety are no longer adequate to the lawful marketing of goods and services. These models call for a shift toward a socially inclusive and democratic approach to the governance of science and technology. They emphasize citizen engagement, ethical outcomes, promotion of science literacy, gender equality, open access, and transparent accountability. They also create the new role of the ethics expert.

The premise of Value-Sensitive Design is that since social values are inexorably incorporated in technological design, we should learn to be conscious and discriminating about it. Algorithms and those who design them should become more caring. Sattarov discusses a version of the Trolley Problem adapted to self-driving cars. How can ethics be programmed in? The Categorical Imperative is a principle for algorithms too, at least it is in Germany. An ethical axiom enunciated by a German Federal Ministry Ethics Commission on Automated Driving states, "In the event of an unavoidable accident situation, any distinction based on personal features (age, gender, physical or mental constitution) is strictly prohibited. It is also prohibited to offset victims against each other."

The concluding chapter is nicely titled, "Power in the Absence of Ethics". Models like Responsible Research and Innovation presuppose democratic institutions. What is technological governance like in societies that lack those? The question is excellent, though also vast. Sattarov's unsurprising conclusion is that technological development can become beset by inequalities of power and the tyranny of entrenched economic interests. The only case he pursues in detail is the manipulation of Internet speed in Iran during politically sensitive moments, which he takes as evidence of the trend toward bringing the Internet under sovereign political authority. The days of the deterritorialized network are numbered, as its technology increasingly embodies politically modulated algorithms to determine and monitor who can do what on the Internet.

The aspirations of this book are systematic and timely, but the book itself is not a satisfying work. Sattarov has nothing to say of his own, no philosophical point, no point at all except to summarize his research literature, and extract every possible distinction. As a revised dissertation, everything is said at least three times: to announce that it will be said, to say it, and to announce that it has been said, usually in exactly the same language, which is tedious enough in a dissertation, and less forgivable in a real book.