Powers: A Study in Metaphysics

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Molnar, George, Powers: A Study in Metaphysics, edited by Stephen Mumford, Oxford, 2003, 256pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 019925978X.

Reviewed by Timothy O'Connor, Indiana University


In this probing little book, George Molnar rightly places the topic of causal power at the center of a proper understanding of many basic issues in metaphysics. His prose style and ontology alike are economical in ways often favored by metaphysicians in his native Australia. (His chapter 'Actuality' is a scant three pages, which he declares to be all that the topic warrants. If you are more skeptical about the virtue of economy in ontology, bear in mind that this does not imply reductionism. All sorts of irreducible dainties can brighten a landscape that is carefully trimmed.) Yet his main contention boldly contests prevailing trends: the powers of objects, says Molnar, are objective, intrinsic, inherently directed to their proper outcome, and irreducible to non-dispositional bases. Others have of late sounded this clarion call against the forces of Mordor (a.k.a. Humean Orthodoxy). Molnar's effort is distinguished by its thoroughness in developing the thesis itself and by setting it within the context of an overarching metaphysics (in Molnar's case, one that is 'broadly naturalistic'). The result still falls somewhat short of the author's aspirations, owing to his untimely death before he could complete a final section putting the theory to work on other problems in philosophy. Here the editor has pieced together a sketchy chapter based on fragmentary notes (as well as providing the missing introduction). But the completed material is itself quite substantial. It is less an original work of philosophy than a compendium of issues and arguments concerning a powers-based metaphysics and its philosophical basis. Molnar advances discussion when he develops the powers thesis in a particular direction.

Molnar begins by defending a view of the metaphysical elements. Properties are real constituents of the spatiotemporal world, as tropes (property-instances), not universals. Tropes are sparse, not isomorphic with the abundant predicates of language. The tropes of a complex object are generally 'derivative' from those of its parts, apart from any (if such there be) which are ontologically emergent. Physical objects cannot be reduced to bundles of tropes, and there are fundamental relations as well. And that is all: the “entities of a given world falling into [the three categories of Objects, Properties, and Relations] are (collectively) necessary and sufficient as truthmakers for all truths about that world” (47). A bold claim, and one that has its attractions, but Molnar doesn't tell us what we are to make of the abundant predicates or concepts, the propositions into which they enter, numbers, and other ostensible denizens of Plato's heaven. One suspects he would follow Armstrong in the hopeless quest of a way to reduce these entities to the favored categories.

The heart of the book develops the details of his theory of properties. Surprisingly, Molnar doesn't work up a sweat on the big divide of universals vs. tropes. Brief and unsubstantiated rhetoric aside (24-5), his case for tropes rests solely on the point that, if we are willing to take as a primitive necessity that tropes are non-transferable, then we may dispense with the universals theorist's states of affairs as a basic ontological category.

The most controverted area for ontological economy is that of the properties of macroscopic objects. The quickest way (though not without its difficulties) to banish worries about causal redundancies in one's system is simply to identify a macroscopic property with a structure of microscopic properties of the object's parts. Is it Molnar's way? The evidence is mixed.

Chapter 1 suggests that it is not. We seem to be given 'derivativeness,' or ontological dependency, as an alternative to identity via mereological complexity. A is ontologically dependent on B just in case “it is impossible for A to exist without B existing, and the impossibility is due to the nature (essence) of A” (29). Far be it for this reviewer to fulminate about any acceptance of necessary connections between distinct existences. Still, a noncausal variety of necessary dependency owing to essence invites further explanation in a way that an identity claim does not. Molnar argues against same-level conjunctive properties (being-round-and-being-square) on the grounds that they would be redundant, and he would presumably register the same complaint here. However, this misses the point: claiming that an object's being A and being B just consists in, just is, its being A and its being B, is to say that once one has taken note of each of the two simpler properties, there is nothing left to count. (Granted, not every sparse theorist taking the route of identity via mereological complexity has appreciated that it is on pain of incoherence a mere notational variant on eliminativism.) Furthermore, it is Molnar's apparently different view that appears to founder on causal redundancy. Suppose A to be a mereologically simple property of a complex object C and to ontologically depend on C's parts' having specific properties and standing in a particular arrangement. Once we chart all the causal contributions of the microscopic properties and their relations, what work is left for A to do? If the answer is, nothing microstructural (this being the province of the properties of C's parts), rather, a macroscopic effect, M, then we seem to have a fine make-work program in place, inventing both the workers and their work in one fell swoop!

At points in chapter 9, however, Molnar appears to embrace the identification of a derivative property, M, of composite object C with the properties of parts of C standing in certain relations (145). Yet even here Molnar does not say that these microscopic properties and relations are parts of M. So one might read him as endorsing a thesis of plural identity—M is (are?) p1, p2, p3…standing in R1. How this is to be understood as an alternative to eliminativism (as Molnar appears to intend) I do not pretend to understand.

Powers or dispositions are irreducible features of reality. Is a property's nature exhausted by the powers it confers (the pure powers theory of Shoemaker)? Or is there also a purely qualitative side or aspect to properties (the two-sided view, once held by C.B. Martin)? Or, finally, should we hold that properties have a unitary nature, which can be conceived in alternative, irreducible ways (the 'neutral monism' of Heil, the later Martin, and Mumford)? Molnar roundly criticizes the last two options. The two-sided view's property 'aspects' look suspiciously like distinct properties that are (mysteriously) necessarily conjoined. And the neutral monist view makes powers out to be non-objective, merely one way of representing what can also be represented as a non-power —a view roughly identical to the antirealism of certain Humeans (156). (But note that for the Humean, there is an asymmetry: 'power' talk is dispensable, whereas conceiving properties as 'qualitative' captures their true nature. Perhaps the neutral monist can rescue his thesis by running the asymmetry in the other direction—although the difference between his view and that of the pure powers theorist then vanishes, at least with regards to metaphysics.)

So Molnar opts for the pure powers view. While the most straightforward, it strikes many as deeply unintuitive, or even incoherent. To say that actuality entirely consists in a nexus of possibility seems to render it insubstantial. Furthermore, our grasp of the nature of any particular power seems to vanish under this conception. If I am told that power P1 is a disposition towards P2 and P3 under circumstances C, all is well provided I already grasp what is signified by P2, P3, and C. But if I am given similarly relational information about P2 (a disposition towards P4 and P5), and so forth, until we eventually work our way back to P1, it can seem that all I have are a series of promissory notes (as Martin puts it) that forever go unfulfilled. I learn the overarching relational structure of reality but lack a grasp of the nonrelational, qualitative character of its nodes. All bones, and no flesh—and might not there be more than one set of possible qualities that conform to this structure?

Molnar stoutly denies the assumption that there are, in effect, physical qualia, analogous to the qualities of experience. Interestingly, he does concede the existence of mental qualia, while wishing to remain neutral on their relationship to the physical (178). He does not consider whether a commitment to immediately apprehended mental qualia might actually be of some help in overcoming the epistemologically-based resistance to the pure powers account of physical properties. I take the most formidable basis for resistance to be one that he does not himself acknowledge, viz., that there might be more than one set of dispositional features having a given relational structure (at least as represented in its total manifestation within a given world). The qualia theorist can say that we uniquely pick out the actual set of physical properties so related in terms of its propensity at certain junctures to give rise to these states, grasped non-relationally. Indeed, we might do even better, by supposing—consistent with the view that certain mental states are directly grasped in introspection—that mental qualia are themselves pure powers. When we speak of what it's like to experience phenomenal purple, we are referring unwittingly to what it's like to grasp a pure power (or cluster of such powers) directly, rather than (as with non-mental properties) conceiving it relationally. The distinctiveness of conscious mental states on this view is not categorial (qualitative vs. dispositional), but rests in their direct accessibility to their subject. Either way, the non-relational grasping of conscious mental qualities can 'tie down' the particular power net of interacting powers constituting the physical realm of the actual world.

Quite apart from where he might come down on mental qualia, Molnar is a dualist about the category of properties. He believes that some basic properties are non-powers: chiefly, certain purely extrinsic relational properties, such as spatial and temporal location and orientation (159-61). Molnar plausibly argues that such non-powers can be causally relevant through the sensitivity of the exercise of powers to relational features such as distance. Such sensitivity is 'written into' the directedness of each basic type of power (164).

It is in his chapter exploring the directedness of powers that Molnar breaks the most ground. Against the famous Brentano thesis that intentionality is the mark of the mental, he argues that “something very much like intentionality is a pervasive and ineliminable feature of the physical world” (61).1 He begins by pointing to parallels in physical powers of characteristic features of intentional mental states: they are directed to their proper manifestation; they can have non-existent objects; they can have description-independent indeterminate objects (e.g., radium decay); they can display non-truth-functionality and referential opacity. He acknowledges that the chief objection to drawing such a parallel lies in recent attempts to outline theories of intentionality in terms of representation, understood as semantic content, or 'aboutness'. As there is nothing (so far as we know) akin to meaningful content in the nature of, e.g., electric charge, Molnar's task is to show that there are non-representational (yet intentional) mental states. He offers three sorts of examples: (i) There are cases of perception in the absence of belief. (ii) Two different acts of perception (sight and touch) can give exactly the same information (hence there is more to the intentionality of these acts than their content). (iii) Bodily sensations such as pain, he argues, are directed to, without either naturally or symbolically meaning their location (80). While his discussion of these cases, particularly the third, is provocative, it is too brief to constitute a convincing case.

Molnar's Powers is sketchy at several points, but this is a forgivable consequence of high ambition and (to a degree of which we cannot be certain) untimely death. Its scope and clarity of argument should enable one to assess the general prospects of his modalized vision of reality, while also providing a fine point of departure for finer-grained research programs.2


1. Here he is developing ideas first suggested by C.B. Martin and K. Pfeifer in “Intentionality and the Non-Psychological” Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 46 (1986), 531-54.

2. I thank Jonathan Jacobs and Dan Ryder for much useful discussion of the book.