Practical Autonomy and Bioethics

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James Stacy Taylor, Practical Autonomy and Bioethics, Routledge, 2009, 211pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415997409.

Reviewed by Gerald Dworkin, University of California, Davis



I was just thinking how often philosophy begins with the promise that if we can manage to get our thinking right about some basic concept we can go on to reconstruct our thinking about everything else — and then how rarely this later part of the programme is ever reached. — Michael Frayn, Landing on the Sun

A new graduate student might understandably believe that the concept of autonomy has been a serious topic of discussion for the last hundred years. Many books, hundreds of articles, have been published on the topic both in the theoretical and applied fields of moral philosophy. I doubt if one can find a textbook or reader in bioethics that does not have autonomy in its index. Nevertheless, in the 1967 edition of the multi-volumed Encyclopedia of Philosophy there is no mention of the term in the index. In that year medical ethics was just beginning its rise to prominence. The Hastings Center — the ur-institution for medical ethics — was founded in 1969.

An interesting sociological question is which factors account for the recent prominence of the concept of autonomy. One has to go back to Kant to find it playing a prominent role in philosophy and the Kantian conception is quite different from the contemporary one. Articles published by Frankfurt1 and myself 2 played a role in starting the discussion, but perhaps we were we already influenced in our choice of topic by sociological factors of which we were not conscious.

It is quite natural that a counter-reaction is making its appearance. A good example is a book by Willard Gaylin and Bruce Jennings.3 Gaylin is the co-founder of the Hastings Center and Jennings is its current president. They state their opposition quite plainly:

Our thesis in this book is that the morality of independence and mutual responsibility has been clashing with increasing frequency and harshness for the past 30 years and that autonomy has won in these clashes too often… . Autonomy’s success in the struggle for the American moral imagination has made it overbearing and overweening. (p. 4)

Taylor’s book is an interesting contribution to the contemporary debate. The book is intended to do two things: first, to develop a defensible version of the concept of autonomy, and second, to develop a concept useful to those who are working in the area of bioethics. Taylor accepts the idea that there is no univocal understanding of autonomy and that any analysis will have to be partly stipulative. But for his project to be successful he needs it to be true that autonomy has what he calls “connotative contours” that can be “captured” by his account of autonomy. By this he means something like a consensus on very general truths about the nature of autonomy. These are similar to what Pettit and Jackson refer to as “platitudes” with reference to the various moral properties. So, for Taylor, it is “generally accepted” that:

1) autonomy is a property of persons

2) autonomy is primarily a property of persons with respect to their local attributes, such as their choices

3) the actions of autonomous persons are not subject to the direction of others, as a slave’s actions are subject to the directions of his master, or a soldier’s are subject to the directions of his officers. (pp. 2-3)

By “generally accepted”, Taylor sometimes means “as used in contemporary philosophical discussion” (p. 2). But he wants to develop an account of practical autonomy that will be judgmentally relevant to debates in “moral philosophy, in general, and bioethics, in particular” (p. 51).

Chapter 1 is devoted to developing a concept of practical autonomy with various conditions. The first, and one that plays an important role in later discussion, is the Threshold condition:

It is necessary for a person to be autonomous with respect to a decision that she makes that (i) the information on which she based the decision has not been affected by another agent with the end of leading her to make a particular decision … (ii) if the information on which a person makes her decision [has been so affected] she is aware of the way in which is has been so affected. (iii) [if i and ii are false] then she did not make [the decision that the intervening agent intended her to make]. (p. 7)

The rest of the chapter is devoted to distinguishing and justifying his approach from others such as the historical account or internalist accounts. On Taylor’s view we cannot tell if a person is autonomous with respect to a decision simply by referring to internal factors such as her mental states. This is obvious from condition (i) above.

Chapter 2 argues against the idea that there are too many different accounts of autonomy for there to be any widely accepted, common concept. Taylor goes through various authors who have maintained the contrary (Feinberg, Dworkin, Vargas, Arpaly) and tries to show that either they have no textual basis for saying that, e.g., autonomy has been held to be identical to negative liberty; or that where there is such evidence they are not analyzing the notion of personal autonomy that Taylor puts forward; or that the theorist is putting forward a necessary condition for having autonomy and not a concept of autonomy itself.

Chapter 3 is an attack on those who take Frankfurt to have developed a concept of autonomy. In Taylor’s view, Frankfurt’s conception of “self-identification” is a metaphysical conception having to do with issues of free-will and responsibility. By contrast, his own conception is a political one in the sense that it has to do with how a person’s decisions have been affected by other agents.

In Chapter 4 Taylor continues this theme, arguing that if we understand the concept of self-identification properly we can see that it is a distinct notion from that of autonomy and that only the latter is relevant to “contemporary moral philosophy, in general, and bioethics, in particular” (p. 51).

Chapter 5 argues against content-neutral theories of autonomy, i.e. the idea that there are no substantive constraints on the contents of the desires, motives, or values that could motivate autonomous decision-making. Taylor argues for a “minimally substantive” account. The minimum condition is important if it is to play a role in thinking about bioethical issues in a pluralist society with many different value commitments. We need to make arguments that can appeal to both the Jehovah’s Witness and those, like myself, who seeing such a pair on my front steps wishes there were a Jehovah’s Witness Protection Program.

Chapters 6-10 (roughly half the book) use the framework of personal autonomy to think about various issues that arise in the biomedical context. They deal with autonomy and choice, autonomy and constraint, autonomy and privacy, autonomy and patient confidentiality, and the general value of autonomy for bioethics.

The issue I want to raise is whether there might be some tension between the two goals that guide Taylor. He wants a defensible conception of autonomy and he wants a concept that will be relevant to thinking about various bioethical issues. Now there is certainly no a priori reason for thinking one can accomplish both goals. It might turn out that the only defensible conceptions (where defensible has to be spelled out in terms of such criteria as consistency, empirical possibility, normative and judgmental relevance) is not one that is either in use, or useful to use, in thinking about such issues as whether there should be a market for kidneys, or can prisoners give informed consent, or should we amputate the healthy leg of a patient who wants us to do this.

If one looks at the last three chapters it seems to me that the payoff of a lot of sophisticated philosophical discussion in the first five chapters is pretty slim.

Chapter 6 explores the question of whether, from the standpoint of autonomy, more choices are better than less. The importance of this issue is supposed to be that

It has, for example, been argued by some bioethicists that persons who value autonomy should be in favor of markets in human kidneys and ova, commercial surrogate pregnancy, elective amputation and radical cosmetic surgery, and prenatal genetic diagnosis. (p. 83)

But those who have argued for these views have never, to my knowledge, relied on the premise that these policies increased autonomy as the sole support. Many arguments rely only on the claim that in some cases more choices increase well-being, as for example the view that markets for kidneys would increase their supply, and people who would otherwise die will live. Others may use some argument for autonomy but it may not have anything to do with Taylor’s idea of personal autonomy. I am cited (correctly) as supporting a market in kidneys and, in particular for the view that “markets can increase … autonomy.” But the notion of autonomy I use is bodily autonomy. I say that “individuals have a right to dispose of their bodily organs and other bodily parts if they so choose. By recognizing such a right we respect the bodily autonomy of individuals, that is, their capacity to make choices about how their body is to be treated by others.”4

In the chapter, Taylor argues that on his account of personal autonomy it need not be the case that fewer choices must be better than more, and that generally more will be better than less. He concedes at the end of the chapter, however, that even when it is the case that for some set of individuals less choice is better than more “the arguments in this chapter cannot be used to support arguments that are offered at the level of public policy” (p. 95).

In Chapters 7 Taylor argues that being constrained is not incompatible with a person’s autonomy. While this claim seems correct again there is no direct connection with bioethical issues. Indeed the only mention of a bioethical issues occurs in the last sentence of the paragraph — a throw-away reference to a market for kidneys.

Chapter 8 — the title of which is Autonomy, Privacy and Patient Confidentiality — would seem right on the bioethical target. But Taylor’s main thesis is entirely negative; he argues against the view that maintaining patient confidentiality is justified out of respect for a patient’s autonomy. Well, negative results can be valuable too. Taylor actually believes, however, there is a contingent connection between the violation of a person’s privacy and compromising her autonomy so it is possible that violation of patient confidentiality is related to lack of respect for autonomy. Nevertheless the conditions under which this is true, according to Taylor, are frequently not met. Again, it looks as if autonomy is not going to have much role in justifying confidentiality.

Chapter 9, on informed consent, again winds its somewhat tortuous way to a similar conclusion. The ethical foundations of informed consent are not autonomy-based although the instrumental value of autonomy can sometimes be part of an argument for securing informed consent.

The conclusion is particularly confusing. He claims "that a person who values autonomy should … generally prefer that persons have more choices rather than fewer (p. 158). Actually in Chapter 6 his conclusion is that "[a person’s] having fewer choices might be better than her having more" (p. 93, author’s italics). In Chapter 7 he claims that from the point of view of autonomy “a person’s having more choices is (typically) preferable to her having fewer” (p. 113). However the argument for this claim is that someone who values autonomy should not be concerned about “how many choices a person might have but whether the choices that she has access to are those that she would wish to pursue” (p. 113). The premise seems right, but the conclusion does not follow from it.

In any case, accepting the claim for the sake of argument, what bioethical conclusion does Taylor argue for?

©oncern for practical autonomy should lead one to oppose public policies that are intended to restrict persons’ choice sets, such as laws prohibiting (or even highly regulating) current markets in human organs. (p. 158)

Clearly, however, this does not follow from Taylor’s conclusion that more choices are (typically) better than less. Leaving aside that any such opposition should lead one to oppose laws against theft (which restrict persons’ choice sets), the decision to oppose laws prohibiting the sale of organs is going to depend on a large number of mainly empirical questions about the consequences of such laws for the supply of organs, on distributional issues about who would get the organs, on questions of fairness and exploitation.

It isn’t even clear that the premise about choices supports a prima facie objection to prohibiting a market in organs since, as Taylor admits, sometimes it is better from the standpoint of autonomy to have fewer choices.

Given that Taylor’s analysis of personal autonomy either has very weak implications for the bioethical questions he considers, or no relevance at all, is the first part of the book successful in developing a “defensible” conception of autonomy? In my view a defensible account of autonomy requires more than a clear, empirically possible, consistent concept that is in accord with some pattern of usage. It must define an ideal that is relevant to some set of problems and questions. It may be a notion of autonomy used to oppose perfectionistic or paternalistic views. It may be a concept used to argue for the illegitimacy of obedience to authority. It may be a concept used to think about various bioethical issues.

Since Taylor’s concept is intended to throw light on, and is guided by, bioethical concerns, the failure to illuminate such issues is, in my view, a defect in theory as well as practice.

1 Frankfurt, H., “Freedom of the Will and the Concept of a Person”, Journal of Philosophy, 1971.

2 Dworkin, G., “Acting Freely”, Nous, 1970.

3 Gaylin, W. and B. Jennings, The Perversion of Autonomy, Georgeown University Press, 2003.

4 Dworkin, G., “Markets and Morals: The Case for Organ Sales”, reprinted in G. Dworkin (ed.), Morality Harm and the Law, Westview, 1994, p. 156.