Practical Conflicts: New Philosophical Essays

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Peter Baumann and Monika Betzler (eds.), Practical Conflicts: New Philosophical Essays, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 344pp, $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521012104.

Reviewed by Terrance McConnell, University of North Carolina, Greensboro


This volume consists of an introductory essay by the editors and thirteen single-authored articles, including one by each of the editors. The title, Practical Conflicts, may lead one expect that the focus will be on conflicting moral obligations, as is the case in other well-known anthologies [for example, Christopher Gowans (ed.), Moral Dilemmas (Oxford University Press, 1987), and H.E. Mason (ed.), Moral Dilemmas and Moral Theory (Oxford University Press, 1996)]. But the scope of these papers is broader. Only one of the contributions, Christine Korsgaard's "The Myth of Egoism," has been previously published.

The editors explain that many different reasons for actions can conflict. The list of potentially conflicting items includes desires, preferences, emotions, goals, commitments, virtues, and obligations. "Because all these different reasons are action-guiding claims, we call conflicts between them 'practical conflicts'" (p. 1). As a result, the articles collected here discuss not only moral dilemmas, but also Kant's rationalism, egoism, deliberating about conflicting desires, aspects of decision theory, inevitable agent regret in conflict situations, whether virtues can conflict, weakness of will, dilemmas in transitional justice, and moral responsibility in conflict situations. This breadth of topics is, ironically, both a strength and a weakness of this book, I think. In a review of this length, it is not feasible to summarize each of the contributions. I will restrict myself to a selected few, and then discuss the unity - or lack thereof - of the collection. It should be stated at the outset, however, that each essay in this book is philosophically astute, challenging, and interesting on its own.

David Velleman's essay discusses what he calls "concessive Kantianism." According to Velleman, Kant is committed to (i) that wrongdoing entails irrationality in the agent, and (ii) that wrongdoing entails irrationality in the action. "Concessive Kantianism" affirms claim (i) but denies (ii). Velleman utilizes a case of Bernard Williams. A particular husband, we are told, should be nicer to his wife. But given this husband's own motivational profile (his own desires, preferences, etc.), he may not have a reason to be nicer to his wife. If a husband no longer has reasons to be nicer to his wife, he normally will have lost reasons for remaining married. So the man is committed to conflicting projects - his particular desires versus his staying in the marriage. In practical reasoning, the reasons with which agents must deal are served up by their own personalities and circumstances, for which they are partly responsible. So the husband should get himself out of this bind. The irrationality in the agent, his "immoral identity," is his commitment to conflicting projects. But, Velleman argues, as long as the agent tolerates this, according to concessive Kantianism he may have insufficient reasons for acting morally.

Henry Richardson tells us that conflicts of desires are pervasive and mundane. Richardson calls the current understanding of desires dyadic functionalism; desires are distinguished in that they have different objects and different strengths. Richardson does not object to the functionalism, but rather to its two-dimensionality. He argues that we can only understand how agents cope with conflicts of desires by adding a third dimension (from Aristotle), "place" - the location of the desire's object within the agent's values or ends (p. 103). The simpler, dyadic functionalist account may be adequate to explain human action from the outside; but it is inadequate from the point of view of the deliberator. An Aristotelian account, from the deliberator's perspective, suggests three states: a belief that I can X, a perception that X-ing is good in some respect, and a desire to X because of the respect in which it is good. It is perception that differentiates the dyadic account from the one favored by Richardson. When an agent experiences conflicting desires, it is the dimension of place that indicates how she will resolve the conflict.

Ruth Chang addresses conflicts between moral and prudential values, between morality and well-being. Such conflicts raise issues about the normativity of morality and the scope of practical reason. According to the standard picture, moral and prudential values issue from two fundamentally distinct points of view. And if there is no more comprehensive point of view, it is difficult to see why an agent should do anything other than what makes her life go best (p. 118). Chang argues that a rational resolution of this type of conflict requires that "values from fundamentally distinct points of view can be put on the same normative page" (p. 119). Chang proposes an approach for putting together morality and well-being, one that invokes a more comprehensive value. Chang suggests that there is a more comprehensive value V with m and p as parts that accounts for the reason-giving force of m in the face of conflicts with p and which determines the rational resolution of the conflict. Chang dubs this "the nameless value approach" to putting together morality and well-being. She gives two arguments for this approach (pp. 144-147): one is an argument from analogy; the other, an argument from circumstances. Chang argues ingeniously that conflicts between morality and well-being are resolvable only if there is this more comprehensive nameless value that has the conflicting values as parts. This is the most original contribution to this collection.

Joseph Raz distinguishes two questions. Is there a right answer in conflict situations? Is there something unfortunate about conflicts? His focus is on the latter. Normative conflict involves a plurality of irreducibly distinct concerns supporting various options. The "unfortunate" aspect of conflict is a common result of pluralism, but pluralism doesn't always lead to conflict. Moreover, there are single-value conflicts. Conflicts are unfortunate when, no matter what the agent does, there will be an unsatisfied reason left behind (p. 181). Raz's core definition of practical conflicts is in terms of "the impossibility of complete conformity" (p. 186). The impossibility of an agent's conduct conforming completely with reason is what is distinctive about practical conflicts. Raz advances what he calls the conformity principle: "One should conform to reason completely, insofar as one can. If one cannot, one should come as close to complete conformity as possible" (p. 189). Not being able to conform with reason completely provides occasions for regret, the need to compensate aggrieved parties, and the appropriateness of apologizing to affected individuals. Highlighting what is unfortunate about conflicts shows that "what matters is what we do, how we live, and whether we respond to reason, and not what we intend" (p. 193).

Monika Betzler focuses on regret that follows even after a seemingly justified choice between conflicting options. Much has been made of this moral residue in the debate about moral dilemmas. It is "rationalists" (those who believe that practical conflicts can be completely resolved) who must bear the most weight in explaining why regret after an apparently correct decision is nevertheless rational. Betzler thinks that the appropriateness of regret in these situations has not been adequately explained. She argues that regret is reason-responsive in ways that have been overlooked. Forgoing one of our commitments, even when done for better reasons, still leaves intact what we consider valuable. Regret is an evaluative attitude responsive to what we have reason to value even though we cannot appropriately act on it (p. 202). Commitments forgone can engender multiple kinds of regret, depending on the sort of loss that has occurred.

Peter Baumann argues for what he calls a "preface paradox for goals" (p. 244). Based on the very concept of a goal, Baumann derives the claim, "An agent does not have an indefeasible reason not to want that all his goals will be realized" (p. 247). But he also argues that the following should be accepted: "An agent has an indefeasible reason not to want that all his goals will be realized." The two claims are contradictory. But the latter claim is defended by imagining what the world would be like if one always, inevitably accomplished all of one's goals. In a word, he says, it would be "boring." Though the contradiction cannot be eliminated, Baumann tries to lessen the pain by saying that it is based on a conflict between two perspectives that people take on their actions: the "involved" perspective of the agent and the "detached" perspective of the reflective person (p. 249). Baumann concludes by arguing that moves available for escaping the "preface paradox for beliefs" will not help to avoid the preface paradox for goals (pp. 256-257).

Peter Schaber most directly discusses moral dilemmas. Schaber takes as a paradigm of a moral conflict Bernard Williams's famous case of Jim, Pedro, and the Indians. Is this an insolvable moral conflict? Schaber argues that a small subset of conflicts are insolvable. In particular, he argues that conflicts of moral reasons are insolvable only if the reasons are theoretically incommensurable, practically incommensurable (they should not be compared), and symmetrical (neither reason is dominated by the other). Williams's case fits the bill, he thinks, and so is an insolvable moral conflict. But, Schaber argues, neither accepting nor not accepting Pedro's "offer" would be wrong (pp. 288-289). Thus those who say that insolvable moral conflicts involve "inescapable wrongdoing" are mistaken.

"Moral Dilemmas of Transitional Justice" is Jon Elster's contribution to this volume. Here Elster is concerned with how regimes come to terms with the past in a transition to democracy. How should officers of a democratic government deal with persons from a past, unjust regime? Elster highlights the conflict between a desire for substantive retributive justice (punishing perpetrators of injustice) and a desire to follow procedurally correct principles (not engage in retroactive legislation). Numerous other practical problems are discussed.

In order to demonstrate the breadth of topics discussed, let me just mention contributors not discussed above. Christine Korsgaard writes about egoism. Isaac Levi discusses aspects of decision theory. Nicholas White addresses the possibility of conflicting virtues. Alfred Mele's essay is about akrasia. And Barbara Guckes discusses the possible connection between practical conflicts, free will, and responsibility.

I said earlier that I think this breadth is a source of both a strength and a weakness of this book. The contributors are all outstanding philosophers and in most cases the essays are quite interesting. Deleting any of them would have been a loss. But it is a real strain to say that these essays are unified. When contributions range from akrasia, to free will and responsibility, to transitional justice, to moral dilemmas, to decision theory, to Kant's ethics, to egoism, and to Aristotle, it takes acute vision to see commonality. It is true that what the editors count as practical conflicts are conflicts among different reasons for action, including "desires, preferences, emotions, interests, goals, plans, commitments, values, virtues, obligations, and moral norms" (p. 1). But then what is excluded? Under this guise, one could include so-called "applied" topics (such as the pros and cons of legalizing voluntary active euthanasia, or various aspects of whistle-blowing), or very abstract topics, such as the adequacy of fundamental principles in deontic logic.

So for whom will this book be useful? While there is probably no one scholar who will find all of the articles pertinent to his or her work, each contribution is significant in its area. So, for example, those who work on the topic of moral dilemmas will find useful the articles by Betzler, by Raz, and by Schaber. And those interested in the question "Why be moral?" will certainly benefit from the piece by Chang. Could one reasonably use this book in the classroom? I can imagine a graduate seminar on "Practical Reason" where this would be an apt text. Even there, most would use selected essays, depending on what aspects of practical reason they wished to emphasize. This, of course, is not much of a weakness; most anthologies used in graduate seminars are used selectively.

While it would not be fair to say of this book that the whole is less than the sum of its parts, it is, I think, accurate to say that this collection of outstanding essays is unified only in a weak sense.