Practical Knowledge: Selected Essays

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Kieran Setiya, Practical Knowledge: Selected Essays, Oxford University Press, 2017, 308pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190462925.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, Birkbeck, University of London


This book is a collection of twelve essays, originally published between 2004 and 2014, preceded by a substantial and explanatory introduction. The topics are the nature of intentional action; the relationship between the reasons for which agents do and ought to act; and the nature of their first-personal knowledge of the intentions and reasons for which they do act. The scope of the essays is the intersection of action theory and ethics, broadly understood. The content partly overlaps with and partly complements work previously published by the author in his Reasons without Rationalism (2007) and Knowing Right from Wrong (2012). The result is a complex tapestry of interrelated claims about what it is for agents to act intentionally and for (good and bad) reasons, with frequently interesting and occasionally surprising implications for a range of disputed questions in ethics, the philosophy of mind, and what has come to be known as ‘meta-normativity’. Although the book is not an easy read, and the intensely networked and dialectical embedding of its arguments will make it hard for even some educated readers to grasp the full significance of the contrasts drawn between the theses defended and the various alternatives from which they are said to importantly differ, every essay in this collection will repay careful study.

The term ‘practical knowledge’ in the title refers to at least three different things, each of which is treated at some length (I will take them in reverse of Setiya’s order). First, it refers to knowledge of practical reason, or knowledge that is ethical in the broadest sense of the term. This kind of practical knowledge is mainly discussed in the second part of the book, which is partly focused on the nature and foundations of knowledge about what one ought to do; what there is reason to do; or what it is good to do. Second, ‘practical knowledge’ refers to knowledge of how to do the things one does intentionally. This kind of knowledge is mainly discussed in the first part, which is focused on the nature of intentional action and what it is to intend to do something; to do something intentionally; and to do things for reasons. Third, ‘practical knowledge’ refers to knowledge of what one is doing when one is doing it intentionally, and why one is doing it. This kind of knowledge is also discussed in the first part of the book, and is also in a sense the key to the whole enterprise. The main idea here is that the knowledge an agent has of what she is doing when she is doing it intentionally crucially depends on her knowledge of how to do the thing she intentionally does (and so on ‘practical knowledge’ in the second sense). In what follows, I review the main conclusions of the book and say something about why they matter. In doing so, I work ‘backwards’: from questions of about the wider significance of the main conclusions towards the narrower questions about the nature of intentional agency that lie at its core.

The main theses of the second part of the book are broadly as follows. The standards of practical reason are standards of ethical virtue, as applied to practical thought. The best kind of practical thinking is the kind of thinking exemplified by a (real or imaginary) virtuous person, who cares about the right things in the right way. This kind of thinking is not available to everyone. You have to be blessed with the right psychophysical capacities, and have to be properly brought up. It follows that the standards of practical reason and the ‘normative reasons’ they provide are genuinely ‘external’ with respect to the actual motivations of many rational agents. The normative reasons that practical reason provides are identified as premises (not conclusions) of sound practical thinking. It follows that so-called ‘Humean’, ‘internalist’, and various other ‘dispositional’ theories of practical reason are all false.

Moreover, so are all philosophical theories that seek to draw substantially ethical conclusions from a theory of rational agency, including so-called ‘Kantian’, or ‘rationalist’, theories that derive substantially ethical success conditions for human action from standards ‘constitutive’ of rational action. The same goes for teleological theories (including theories with a broadly ‘Aristotelian’ flavour) that seek to draw substantially ethical conclusions from the alleged fact that all rational agents must be interpreted as acting under ‘the guise of the good’. As Setiya argues with some plausibility in an essay entitled ‘Sympathy for the Devil’, they do not. Normative reasons are irreducibly distinct from the ‘explanatory’ or ‘motivating’ reasons to which we appeal in explaining rational action to ourselves and others. In particular, there is no requirement that agents must represent their actions as being (even prima facie) good things to do, or as having (even prima facie) anything interesting to be said in their favour. Setiya does not deny the core ‘constitutivist’ insight that there is a valid argument from the metaphysics of agency to some basic norms of practical reason. The problem with any such argument, or so he argues, is that the nature of rational agency as such is too ‘thin’ to provide the premises to support any ethical conclusions. The inherent ‘success conditions’ of ‘basic’ agency (or of ‘planning’ agency, in the sense made famous by Michael Bratman) is just that the agents in question do whatever it is they set themselves (or plan) to do. And although it is arguably true that there are beings (such as birds and bees, and maybe even humans) who will only be truly successful as the kind of things they are if they behave in specific ways in the context of their natural environment or ecological niche, there is no such thing as a ‘natural environment’ or ecological niche of the relevant kind to make certain action profiles (such as ‘ethical’ action profiles) normatively authoritative for rational agents merely as such, at least as a matter of a priori necessity.

There is much more to be said about these issues than Setiya does in this book (and certainly more than can be helpfully said in a short book review). The details of Setiya’s views on ethical knowledge should in any case be sought not in these pages, but in Knowing Right from Wrong. Even so, the message of the essays in the second part of Practical Knowledge is newsworthy enough as things stand. For if Setiya is right, the entire project of grounding a theory of ‘political’, ‘moral’, ‘ethical’, or indeed any kind of substantial practical normativity on a general theory of what it is to act intentionally for reasons is doomed to failure. If substantial ethical thought has any kind of foundation, it is not to be sought in the philosophy of mind or action.

The upshot of all this is a reading of the book according to which the insights of its first and second parts are substantially independent of each other. As Setiya himself puts it, ‘Moral philosophers should think about the metaphysics of agency not because it is the foundation of ethics, but in order to see that it is not’ (33). That is aptly put. For it would clearly be a mistake to think of these two areas of philosophical inquiry as entirely unrelated. One obvious reason is that questions frequently arise in the course of our thinking about reasons and rationality where it is simply not clear from the outset in which pre-conceived ‘domain’ of inquiry the answer is to be sought. One case in point is Setiya’s take on the so-called ‘instrumental principle’, or the claim that one must intend the necessary means to one’s ends. On standard accounts, this principle is one of the core (if not the core) principle of sound ‘practical’ reasoning. On Setiya’s view (and he is not the first philosopher to have made this suggestion), the instrumental principle is an epistemological principle that applies to the beliefs that figure in means-ends reasoning, and so is a principle of ‘theoretical’ reason. (The distinction between the ‘practical’ and the ‘theoretical’ is one of the relatively few to remain unchallenged in this book.)

This is an intriguing suggestion. The rational failure involved when I keep putting the washing liquid in the fridge rather than by the washing machine as I intended is now to be regarded as either a matter of doing something poor or otherwise inappropriate (by putting the washing liquid in a bad place), or alternatively as a matter of holding an irrational set of beliefs (by failing to draw the obvious conclusions about what placing the washing liquid by the washing machine actually requires by way of means). Thus understood, the rational failure in question has nothing essentially to do with the practical failure of execution implied by not forming and bringing to fruition the relevant auxiliary intentions themselves, however tempting it may be to say so.

The cluster of theses defended in the first part of the book can be summarized roughly as follows. All genuinely intentional action involves knowledge of what one is doing, or of what one is going to do. It is practical knowledge ‘in intention’. On this view, all intentions involve at least some degree of confidence (or ‘partial belief’) that one will successfully do what one intends to do when one sets out to do it. Hence, intentions are at least partly ‘cognitive’. Yet practical knowledge in intention does not depend on either prior inference or sufficient prior evidence that the intentional action in question will be successful. Instead, practical knowledge in intention is genuine knowledge because it combines with requisite capacities or dispositions to actually bring about what the agent intends when the opportunity arises. The presence of these capacities and dispositions make it rational for agents to form the relevant intentions; they justify the agents’ partial beliefs that the actions they intend will be performed successfully; and they ensure that the agents’ confidence that they will successfully execute their intentions is epistemically ‘safe’. In this way, practical knowledge of what one is doing or going to do is said to ‘rest on’, and partly be explained by, a form of ‘knowing how’ (in the sense introduced by Gilbert Ryle in the 1940’s).

The aforementioned package of theses allows Setiya to make plausible sense of some otherwise extremely dubious claims that lie at the heart of his concerns in the first part of the book. One of these is Stuart Hampshire’s contention, in his Thought and Action, that if ‘a man is doing something without knowing that he is doing it, then it must be true that he is not doing it intentionally’. Another is Elizabeth Anscombe’s even more remarkable contention, in her Intention, that the question of ‘why’ someone did something is ‘refused application by the answer: “I was not aware I was doing that”’. The theory of intentional action contained in Anscombe’s ground breaking work, first published in 1957, is currently undergoing something of a revival in mainstream philosophy. The essays republished in the first part of the present volume, from the title essay onwards, make a significant contribution to this revival to the extent that they show how Anscombe’s claim (as well as Hampshire’s) can be interpreted so as to be of more than historical interest.

Perhaps one of the most obvious problems with the claims just quoted from Anscombe and Hampshire (as with many other claims made in contemporary philosophy of action) is that on some natural ways of reading them they seriously over-intellectualize the phenomena they purport to describe. This danger of over-intellectualization provides a useful litmus test for any attempt to make sense of such claims, a test that Setiya’s account should be able to pass. For the fact is that most of us are very far from transparent to ourselves. We frequently do things, and embark on quite sophisticated (and sometimes quite unsavoury) projects without having a very clear sense, from the first-personal perspective, of what we are literally ‘up to’ (our extraordinary capacity for elaborate post hoc rationalizations notwithstanding). The resulting problem for the philosopher of action is not so much that she is describing a kind of acting for reasons that never occurs, but rather that she is describing a kind of acting for reasons that hardly ever does. No doubt there are enough clever philosophers around to come up with a coherent interpretation of the claim that we must know whatever it is we are doing when we do it intentionally. But if very little of what we actually do counts as intentional action thus understood, who cares?

One of the more reassuring aspects of Setiya’s view is that it promises to pass this test, and to do so easily. First, when I do something intentionally my doing so falls under more than one description. On Setiya’s account (slightly reworded), when I do something intentionally, I have some confidence that I am doing it, or else I do it by doing some other things, which I do have some confidence that I am doing. This claim is consistent with the following truths about how we are sometimes not transparent to ourselves. First, my beliefs about what I am up to in making sense of a complex negotiation in a new institutional context allows for both fallibility and a lack of full conviction on my part as to what exactly it is I am up to. Second, there may be truths about what I intentionally do that are neither entailed nor evidentially supported in any obvious way by the contents of the propositions that specify what it is that I consciously think I am doing. Whether through envy, self-deception, delusion, or simple ignorance I can intentionally behave in ways that if more fully described would make me look like a stranger to myself. Third, the nature and extent of the capacities and dispositions that stop me from sinking to the bottom as I dive into the sea and swim to the shore need not be fully transparent to me when I ask myself what it is that I am supposed to know. Moreover, they come in degrees, as does my confidence that I have them. Yet the relevant capacities and dispositions can still support the claim: ‘He knows what he is doing’, as I dive into the sea and successfully demonstrate that I really do know how to do it. If I have understood him correctly, each of these ‘failures’ of transparency is fully compatible with Setiya’s claim that whenever we act intentionally, we know what we are doing. If that is true, then the theory of intentional action espoused in this book has even more to recommend it than is explicitly propounded within its pages.