Practical Rationality and Preference: Essays for David Gauthier

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Morris, Christopher W., and Ripstein, Arthur (eds.), Practical Rationality and Preference: Essays for David Gauthier, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 239 pp, $54.95 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-78184-1.

Reviewed by Alan H. Goldman , University of Miami


There must be few if any disciplines other than philosophy in which the highest honor is to have one’s distinguished colleagues explain in print why all of one’s views are wrong. This collection of essays for David Gauthier continues this fine tradition, with such luminaries as Derek Parfit, Robert Brandom, and Edward McClennen providing the criticisms. The essays are of consistently high quality, making this book essential reading for those interested in decision theory and broader issues relating to practical rationality.

I shall recommend only by indicating the topics and broad themes of most of these essays, reserving my critical comments for the minority that address the nature of preferences and their relation to reasons for actions. In the former group are two that are broadly supportive of Gauthier’s theory of rationality, and which therefore might better have been placed first in the collection. In his chapter Michael Thompson discusses what is common to practices, rules, and dispositions that enables them to transfer justification to instances or particular actions that otherwise would be unjustified. He claims that such general practices must themselves be characterized in normative terms. In his article Edward McClennen expands upon his earlier writings by arguing for a model of rationality different from that which strategically aims at equilibria that may be sub-optimal. The model derives not from the usual conflict-of-interest games, but from coordination games in which individuals commit to rules that make cooperation possible. It aims at Pareto optimality in collective outcomes and therefore requires resolute commitment to rules.

Other articles are broadly critical of principal or ancillary claims in Gauthier’s theory. Derek Parfit argues once more by convincing examples that it is not always rational to act on a rationally formed or maintained disposition, a theorem seemingly essential to Gauthier’s theory of rationally constrained maximization (of preference satisfaction). Along similar lines, Adam Morton questions, among other things, whether a rational action can fail to be the best to perform in the context in question. Does it help that it results from a rationally acquired disposition if it is not best? He then focuses on the development of psychological traits that allow for long-range commitment and cooperation. In his article, John Broome develops an account of intentions in which they are not themselves reasons for actions (if you have no reason to do something, you cannot create a reason just by intending to do it), but nevertheless have normative force if not repudiated. Peter Danielson argues from evolutionary game theory that instrumental rationality requires less moral constraint than Gauthier advocates, and that more information does not always generate more prudentially rational moral behavior. Finally, Candace Vogler appeals to Rousseau’s implicit conception of the individual to question broadly the conception implicit in the liberal economic model that Gauthier accepts.

The three articles that address the concept of preference and its relation to reasons are those of Robert Brandom, Arthur Ripstein, and Claire Finkelstein. All three argue against Gauthier’s derivation of reasons from preferences. Brandom argues that Gauthier’s distinctions between verbally expressed and behaviorally revealed preferences and between raw and considered preferences should push him all the way from a Humean to a Kantian view of reasons as not reducible to or derivable from dispositions to choose or preferences. The first distinction is needed to account for irrational choices or weakness of will, and the second is needed because only considered preferences can be candidates for genuine reasons. Weakness of will is analyzed by Brandom as choice that comes apart from verbally expressed preferences. The latter for Brandom express commitments to choose instead of dispositions to choose (behaviorally revealed preferences). For him verbal expressions take priority in the generation of reasons since the conversion of raw preferences into considered ones requires that they have propositional content. Once one frees the generation of reasons from patterns of choices and recognizes their source in commitments, one should be free according to Brandom to recognize reasons derived from commitments that are independent of preferences, for example promises and other such obligations.

Ripstein agrees that the concept of reasons is independent from and even logically prior to that of preferences. He also agrees that if preferences are derived solely from patterns of choices, then we cannot have irrational preferences, either cyclical or akratic. But we can have such preferences and choices based on them. Rational choice, by contrast, may be defined as choice under ideal conditions, but the latter must be defined as conditions in which one chooses what one has most reason to do. Ripstein opposes full-information accounts of ideal conditions and raises what he takes to be unanswerable questions about the presence or absence of emotions in such conditions. At least, he claims, these questions cannot be answered without an independent idea of choice according to best reasons. Thus, what one rationally ought to do is different from a prediction of what one will do based on past patterns of choice. The notion of a reason is logically independent of the notion of behaviorally revealed preferences.

In her article Finkelstein continues this attack on the derivation of reasons from preferences by arguing that the preference maximization view of rationality cannot protect adequately against temporary changes in preference, the fulfillment of which will be later regretted. According to her interpretation of Gauthier, a person can resist such temptation only if she has a prior plan or formed disposition to do so, since Gauthier allows the overriding of present preference only by a rationally formed disposition to be resolute. But, aside from Parfitian questions about the rationality of acting on such dispositions, it may be rational to resist simply on the ground that one will later regret not doing so, and without foresight of the temptation or a prior plan. Finkelstein argues from this point to a more general counter-preferential account of rational decision.

As mentioned above, Gauthier himself distinguishes between behaviorally revealed and verbally expressed preferences. He does not give either priority over the other, holding that when these diverge, there is no answer as to what rationality requires in the way of preference satisfaction. Brandom, we have seen, gives priority to verbally expressed preference in accounting for weakness of will and the transformation to considered preference, for which propositional content is required. In filling out the map of these positions, I would side with the economists in giving priority to behaviorally revealed preferences, although I would not side with them (or with Donald Davidson) in always construing them as rational where possible. And I side with Gauthier in wanting to avoid the move all the way to an account of reasons independent of subjective preferences or desires. There is a price to pay for giving up the idea of a conceptual connection between what is good for individuals, what they have reason to choose, and what they do choose when relevantly informed and coherent.

Moving all the way to an objective list account of goodness or reasons is metaphysically rash in seeming to introduce irreducibly normative facts into the world independent of subjects. Not only does this introduce a superfluous "queerness" into our ontology, it is counterintuitive on other grounds. What we have prudential reason to do seems to derive from what makes our lives go best, and the latter seems to reduce to what best satisfies our informed and coherent desires or preferences. The objective list account is also psychologically unrealistic. In seeking to improve our desires, to transform them into reasons for action, we do not check them against any such list. Instead, we seek to gain relevant information, especially about their origins and the consequences of acting on them, and we then check to see that they are coherent, that satisfying them will not prevent, and hopefully will facilitate, the satisfaction of other more important desires or preferences.

Granting priority to verbally expressed over behaviorally revealed preferences is also false to the psychology we employ in inferring to the real preferences of others and in acting on our own. To borrow an example from Gauthier, if Karen expresses a preference for reading philosophy over watching TV, but night after night watches TV with her philosophy books closed beside her, then, despite what she says, we judge her to really prefer TV (she might nevertheless prefer that she not prefer TV). In our own case, severing the conceptual connection between choices and preferences nevertheless suggests at least a prudential rule of thumb that we ought to choose what we most prefer. But no such rule is ever followed in pure prudential reasoning. We do not first check what we prefer in order to find out what we ought to choose. Instead, we consider the objects of possible choice in deciding how to choose, and then perhaps check to see that our potential choice is consistent with past choices we have made and those we plan to make. Our own preferences as well as those of others appear to us as reifications of those ongoing patterns of choice, unless, like Karen, we engage in self-deception.

But we still must account for irrationality in choice, and Brandom, Ripstein, Finkelstein, and perhaps even Gauthier all agree that we cannot do so without divorcing preference from choice and introducing either something like verbal expression as at least equally evidentially potent for determining preferences, or reasons as independent from choices and preferences. It appears to me nevertheless that such phenomena as weakness of will can be evident from patterns of choices themselves. The person who is always trying unsuccessfully to diet is obvious from his alternating fasts and binges, as is the person who appears otherwise to want to save his marriage but takes advantage of every opportunity for adulterous affairs. In both cases weakness of will can be inferred more readily from the behavioral patterns than from verbal expressions, which may indicate, as in Karen’s case, only self-deception about true preferences. Thus, an account of akrasia need not give priority to verbally expressed preference, while an account of certain forms of self-deception may well require the priority of preference revealed in choice.

In order to ascribe irrational preferences or choices, we must be able to distinguish incoherence over time from rationally permitted changes in preference. But, as the dieter and adulterer cases illustrate, we can distinguish these by inferences to the best explanations for ongoing patterns of behavior, aided by background beliefs about how people’s choices tend to cohere, how stable they tend to be, in normal cases. Such background beliefs themselves derive from narratives that express lifelong experience with agents both real and fictional. If we can distinguish incoherence from rational change of mind, then, as Finkelstein suggests, we can resist the former by being resolute against temptation on particular occasions without the need for a prior plan to do so.

None of this, of course, is to deny either that verbal expressions of preference normally constitute sound evidence, or that the manipulation of the propositional contents of preferences requires verbal expression. But the latter can express contents implicit (via inference to the best explanation) in prior patterns of behavior, which contents, we have seen, have priority in cases of conflict. Ripstein may be correct that we can discover ideal conditions for rational choice only by assessing the results of choices in various conditions. But this assessment once more need not appeal to reasons independent from choices or preferences, but instead can use the standard of coherence.

Much more argument would be required to draw conclusions on the relations of choices to preferences and preferences to reasons. My comments are intended to raise further questions and encourage attention to these challenging essays on the foundations of decision theory. The only addition that would have improved this collection would have been a reply from Gauthier himself, but that perhaps would have been contra-standard for books of this sort.