Practical Reasoning and Ethical Decision

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Robert Audi, Practical Reasoning and Ethical Decision, Routledge, 2006, 264pp, $33.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415364639.

Reviewed by Hallvard Lillehammer, King's College, Cambridge University


Practical Reasoning and Ethical Decision is the result of more than thirty years of work on ethics and the philosophy of action by one of the most accomplished philosophers currently writing in the field. In a complex and crowded area, it will be an obvious point of future reference. The book is a substantially revised sequel to the author's Practical Reasoning (1989), updated to incorporate the accounts of rationality and ethical theory subsequently presented in The Architecture of Reason (2001) and The Good in the Right (2004). In the current volume, Audi restates his views in each of these areas in light of philosophical developments over the last fifteen years. The result is a sophisticated account of practical reasoning and its role in ethical decision.

The book is divided into three parts. Part I provides a historical summary of what Aristotle, Hume, and Kant had to say about practical reasoning. Here we are introduced to Aristotle's practical syllogism, the infamous claim that the conclusion of a practical syllogism is an action, and the idea that all rational actions are ultimately aimed at a single final end, this end being happiness. We are then introduced to Hume's claim that reason is a slave of the passions and the controversial idea that reason can operate only on the selection of effective means to rationally arbitrary ends. We then get an account of Kant's distinction between hypothetical and categorical imperatives, the former constraining rational agents to take effective means to their ends and the latter constraining rational agents to pursue some ends rather than others.

Potted philosophical histories are fraught with danger. Yet Audi does an expert job of setting out the historical taxonomy on which his own account of practical reasoning is based. In Audi's words, this is an account that is 'in many ways Aristotelian, and beyond that, more Kantian than Humean' (219). What Audi takes from Hume is the central cognitive role of means-end reasoning in all practical reasoning. Where he departs from Hume in the direction of Aristotle is in holding that ends are rationally appraisable in themselves in virtue of being of a certain kind or being favored by sound principles. Where he departs from Aristotle is in denying that all ends are rationally appraisable in virtue of being instrumentally connected to a single final end. Audi is a pluralist about final ends. Nor does what distinguishes an end as favored by practical reason reduce to its pursuit being consistent with a Kantian categorical imperative. Even so, Audi is with Kant in according the distinction between acting out of (as opposed to in mere accordance with) reason a central importance in his theory of practically rational agency.

Part II includes what is arguably the centerpiece of the book. This is what Audi calls the 'cognitive-motivational' conception of practical reasoning (81-104). On this view, practical reasoning is an inferential process that proceeds from one set of propositions to another by means of deductive or (broadly) inductive steps. Practical reasoning so understood is cogent when its premises are true (and therefore 'generative' of reasons), and the process of reasoning is either valid or warranted (and therefore either truth or warrant preserving). The process of practical reasoning has both motivational and cognitive premises. Motivational premises specify the agent's ends. Cognitive premises specify necessary, sufficient, or adequate means to the agent's ends. The process of practical reasoning corresponds to what Audi calls a 'practical argument'. A practical argument is appropriately produced either in response to what Audi calls a 'practical question' raised prior to action, or as an explanation or a rational reconstruction subsequent to action. A practical question is answered by what Audi calls a 'practical judgment', the content of which corresponds to the conclusion of a practical argument. Practical judgments are directive in virtue of both calling for action and disposing rational agents to perform them. Practical judgments are motivationally reason giving. They are normatively reason giving when justified by cogent practical reasoning.

Part III of the book is mainly a discussion of normative principles. It is the longest part of the book, and incorporates a restatement of opinions published by Audi on ethics and practical reason over the last decade. One chapter addresses the much-debated issue of how instrumental rationality can be normative. In this chapter, Audi touches briefly on the growing literature surrounding the alleged distinction between reasons proper and what John Broome has labeled 'normative requirements' (158-171). There is also a chapter in which Audi spells out what he takes to be nine self-evident prima facie moral obligations. These are obligations of justice, non-injury, fidelity, reparation, beneficence, self-improvement, gratitude, liberty, and respectfulness. To each of these obligations there corresponds a moral principle to the effect that we morally should fulfill it. A moral principle may conceivably be outweighed by a non-moral principle, such as a principle of self-interest. Yet Audi maintains that all rational persons, 'when suitably informed and adequately experienced, will tend to act morally' (185). Moral rationalism is in vogue these days, and Audi is not alone among prominent philosophers who think this view of ethics is worth taking seriously (recent defenders of moral rationalism include Michael Smith and Christopher Peacocke). Audi's account of ethical principles and their justification are subject to detailed attention in another of his recent books (The Good in the Right). I shall therefore not say anything about it here.

What I shall say something about is the account that stands out as the book's centerpiece. Audi claims that all intentional action can be represented as the result of a practical argument structured in accordance with the cognitive-motivational conception of practical reasoning. He does not, however, claim that all intentional action is a causal product of practical reasoning. According to Audi, it is a necessary condition for practical reasoning to occur that its main premises are available in the agent's consciousness. Audi disagrees with those (he calls them 'functionalists') who construe all intentional action as a product of an inferential process, conscious or subconscious (consisting, e.g., in the pursuit of maximum expected utility). He attributes such a functionalist view to Donald Davidson and Gilbert Harman. It is unclear to me why Audi thinks he is entitled to reject the functionalist alternative without considering its potential explanatory pay-offs at least partly in empirical terms. Nor is it clear to me that he provides a good argument for the cognitive-motivational conception of practical reasoning in this book, even in cases where such reasoning non-controversially occurs. On the contrary, an argument can be made for the claim that the cognitive-motivational conception could only be plausible on broadly functionalist terms, because practical reasoning as introspectively revealed in consciousness does not always appear to have the kind of linear inferential structure that the cognitive-motivational conception predicts. Consider what Audi calls the 'basic schema for practical reasoning' (96). This schema has the following structure:

Major premise -- the motivational premise: I want X;

Minor premise -- the cognitive (instrumental) premise: My Y-ing would contribute to X;

Conclusion -- the practical judgment: I should Y.

There are two crucial features of this schema. First, it has a strictly linear inferential structure. Second, it is premised on the assumption of a prior motivation in the major premise (Audi allows that this motivation may be either actual, or merely entertained as possible for exploratory purposes). According to Audi, genuine practical reasoning (sound or unsound) proceeds from an assumed goal, through some perceived means to that goal, to a practical judgment favoring action in pursuit of that goal. Why should we think that practical reasoning must have this structure?

Consider first a simple case where actual pre-existing ends are already in conscious view to play the role of major premise. In this case, a bit of armchair introspection may easily appear to throw up a picture of some practical reasoning as having a non-linear structure. Audi comes close to agreeing that non-linear practical reasoning is possible when reflecting on what to do on the basis of one's ends. For example, he allows that the application of his cognitive (instrumental) principle may lead a rational agent to abandon some of his pre-existing ends (190-97). One might assume that this could happen, for example, when a means that is necessary to the promotion of one among an agent's ends is shown to not cohere well with that agent's overall set of beliefs and commitments. If so, why should we think that all practical reasoning must be strictly linear, that it ' … requires an inferential passage from one or more premises to a conclusion' (107), or that ' … Ideally, good practical reasoning expresses a valid underlying argument' (169)? Why cannot making a sound practical judgment on the basis of a more holistic appeal to one's overall assessment of a situation amount to a genuine piece of practical reasoning?

Second, consider the more complicated case where no obvious pre-existing ends are in conscious view to play the role of major premise. In this case, a bit of armchair introspection may easily appear to throw up a picture of some practical reasoning as having a non-linear structure, either in setting ends to play the role of motivational premise, or by issuing directly in a practical judgment that some given action is, in the relevant context, a sensible one to perform. Audi comes close to agreeing that non-linear practical reasoning about possible ends is possible when he considers how we should interpret and weigh possible principles to play the role of major premises in his basic schema, and when he urges us to 'be tentative and seek reflective equilibrium' in balancing our factual beliefs with our moral judgments (193). If so, why should we think that all practical reasoning about possible ends must start from a motivational premise and have a strictly linear structure in accordance with the cognitive-motivational conception? Audi is not as clear as he could be in this book, either about what it is that makes reasoning inferential (86-99), or about what it is that makes reasoning practical (99-101). He may think enough has been said about this elsewhere, or he may be preparing to say more about it in the future. As far as the official formulations in this book are concerned, however, genuine practical reasoning is a strictly linear process, aimed at action, starting from a motivational premise, and then proceeding by deductive or inductive inference to a practical judgment. On this definition, a holistic process of coherent reflection about what to do is never to be counted as a process of genuinely practical reasoning. Why not?

Philosophers are sometimes accused of arguing pointlessly about words. Often this accusation is unfair. Reasonable armchair inquiry is possible, whether in pursuit of non-obvious a priori truth, the conceptual foundations of theory, or the core commitments of pre-theoretical common sense. Other times the accusation is fair. Pre-theoretical common sense is not necessarily indicative of the truth. What is licensed by common sense can change in light of a posteriori inquiry and reflection. Philosophical inquiry aimed only at commitments embodied in pre-theoretical common sense is potentially detached from the pursuit of truth in those areas of thought where the truth can sensibly be thought to extend beyond the content of contemporary common sense. It is partly this restriction of interest that provides ammunition for those who accuse philosophers of having no interest in the real nature of the phenomena they describe, instead proclaiming it a virtue to peddle in platitudes.

The theory of practical reasoning and rational agency is arguably one area where this accusation remains to be answered. In this area, philosophers have been equipped with many of the same conceptual tools since the time of Aristotle. More than two millennia later the debate continues. Is weakness of will possible? Does practical reasoning have the form of a logical syllogism? If so, does it conclude in an action? Is rational action a result of inference? In a short footnote in his book Audi writes that, '… there are empirical questions about what occurs … in various cases when a person reasons, and there is apparently no sharp distinction between these and conceptual questions about what constitutes reasoning. My aim has been to formulate a conception of reasoning … without encroaching on matters left open by the concept of reasoning' (235). Given what the exclusive focus on conceptual issues appears capable of offering on this topic, it is hard to understand why.