Practical Reasoning in a Social World

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Graham, Keith, Practical Reasoning in a Social World, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 214pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521803780.

Reviewed by Raimo Tuomela, University of Helsinki


According to Graham, the aim of the book is “to say something about how a proper understanding of ourselves and our circumstances should make a difference to our practical reasoning”. In particular, he wants to explore how the (normative) reasons we have for acting are affected by the simple thought that we are social creatures. Graham says that his philosophical method is to start with truisms as premises and to try to arrive at surprising, informative consequences. He advocates what he calls “moderate anti-individualism”. Most centrally, this view contains the assumption of the existence of irreducible collective agency in an ontological sense. For Graham, collective agency is a central notion on a par with individual agency, and this view is used to discuss recent, typically individualistic theorizing in social and political philosophy.

Graham’s book is competently written on the whole and shows good understanding of the problems involved. The central importance of the book is that it applies the recent theorizing in the field of “collective intentionality” to problems in social and political as well as moral philosophy, for instance to issues related to the dispute between liberalism and communitarianism. Graham is best in his discussion of problems precisely in the aforementioned fields. He is also familiar with the central issues in the theory of collective intentionality and seems to have read a considerable amount of that literature. Graham’s style is both systematic and discursive. He likes to discuss others’ views and often, but not always, formulates and defends a view of his own. A great variety of issues is discussed and often in a somewhat fleeting way and with less analytical rigor than might be desired.

Practical reasoning in this book does not mean the presentation of logical structures or formal schemas representing reasoning leading to conclusions concerning what one – on moral or other grounds – should do (cf. the practical syllogism and similar patterns). Rather the author is concerned with broader issues related to practical reasoning – such as its sources and constraints.

The book consists of the following chapters in addition to an introduction and a conclusion: 1. Practical reasoning in context, 2.The indistinctness of persons: causal interconnection; 3. The indistinctness of persons: the personhood of collectivities; 4. Practical collective identification and dissociation; 5. Practical reasoning: sources and constraints, 6.Practical reasoning and morality. As Graham himself says, the central chapters of the book are 3 and 4, and I will largely concentrate on them below.

Some of the truisms that Graham starts with concern the issue of the distinctiveness of persons. He considers four different theses concerning this issue: D1) Qualitative Distinctness: Persons considered as a species of entity are distinct from other entities. D2) Distinctness as Separateness: Persons considered individually, rather than as a species, are distinct from one another. D3) Distinctness as Integrity: Persons are distinct in forming a unity. D4) Distinctness as Uniqueness: Persons are distinct in the sense of being distinctive and not being interchangeable. Towards the end of the book on p. 186 he writes:

Just as the fact of causal interconnection, when consistently pursued, necessitates a re-evaluation of D2, the idea of the distinctness of persons construed as separateness, so the fact of collective agency, when similarly pursued, necessitates a re-evaluation of D1, the idea of the distinctness of persons construed qualitatively.

I will discuss causal interconnectionism and collective agency below.

Causal interconnectionism is discussed in Chapter 2, where Graham presents and defends the following causal thesis: Everything a person does carries causal implications for the lives of other human beings. This is a contingent thesis. It does not mean what it may at first sight be taken to mean, namely that all of one’s actions causally affect some other people. Graham gives this thesis the counterintuitive content that in addition to causal consequences it also may concern causal preconditions. Thus, as all members of the species Homo sapiens have parents – a contingent causal precondition – we do have causal implications concerning at least them! My moving my finger in solitude thus is taken somewhat paradoxically to have causal implications concerning other people.

In Chapter 3, Graham analyzes collectivities as follows (pp. 68-69): A number of individual human beings form a collectivity if and only if (i) they act in ways the significance of which can be adequately captured only by an ineliminable reference to some corporate body as part of which they are acting, where (ii) what that corporate body does is distinct from anything which they as individuals do, and where (iii) the corporate body is a persisting one whose survival is relatively indifferent to the persistence of the particular individuals which compose it at any particular moment.

Graham does not aim at a non-circular analytical definition and says that he will rely on the reader’s assent to the existence of collectivities by appeal to the many examples of corporate bodies such as committees, clubs, families, electorates, firms, etc. The actions in (i) must be (to use my terminology) “we-mode” actions, viz. actions performed as a member of the collectivity. As to (ii), Graham takes the distinction to be there on contingent grounds. (This existence of the distinction is of course a well-known fact.) The persistence requirement (iii) seems to me unnecessary, for there are certainly groups formed for some particular tasks or goals and that soon disintegrate. Why exclude them?

Graham’s account of collectivities is very comprehensive. It includes e.g. groups (collectivities) which act unintentionally and whose members do not know that they form a group. (I do not as such object to this idea, and have even myself discussed similar cases, such as spy rings, in my work – see e.g. in Tuomela (1984), pp. 131-2, (1995), Chapter 5, and (2002), Chapter 3. However, in those cases, the group members still have at least a vague idea that they are acting as group members.)

Graham accordingly takes intentional or “transparent” accounts of collectivities to be too narrow. An intentional account takes the members’ intentional states to be somehow constitutive of collectivity. The “phenomenon of the clique” is meant to give an argument against such a view. According to this example, there could be “a number of individuals who know each other well and tend to engage in exchanges which presuppose a great deal of prior acquaintance with their interests, their sense of humor and their ways of relating to one another. Such a group of individuals may collectively exclude other people from their social exchanges ….” He argues that this group of individuals forming the clique would constitute a collectivity. He also says that the members of the clique might act in this way quite unwittingly and unintentionally. They might not be aware that they form a collectivity at all or one of this particular kind; or they might be aware of all of this, but unaware that they had collectively performed some particular action on a particular occasion.

Let us consider the weakest of the aforementioned cases, which may be empirically possible. It involves 1) unintentional and 2) unconscious (unaware) action, and, furthermore, 3) the fact that the members are not aware that they form a collectivity. Suppose thus that the collectivity unintentionally freezes out a person. Thus, the members do not purport (individually or collectively) to freeze out the person. Secondly, they are unaware of their action, viz. they (individually and, of course, collectively) lack the belief that they are freezing out the person in question. As to 3), we can suppose that the members only deal with each other as individuals (“I interact with you and him, and so on”).

In my view, the phenomenon of the clique does not after all require the postulation of a corporate body. All we need to say here is that there are a number of individuals who unconsciously and unintentionally and interconnectedly (or jointly in a wide sense) behave here and jointly cause the freezing out in question. To simplify, suppose we are initially dealing with three persons A, B, and C in the same face-to-face situation. A and B are engaged in intense discussion with each other and seem not to pay attention to the presence of C. Eventually, C, not getting any attention, leaves the others and “the situation”. Here A and B unintentionally jointly caused this consequence by their interconnected behavior, their behaviors being at least jointly sufficient and perhaps separately necessary for the consequence. While we may say that the constellation or “corporate body” consisting of the agents A and B and their relevant physical and mental interactions (not involving, however, anything like their intention to freeze out C) caused the freezing out phenomenon, we can equally well just say that A and B were the agents of the situation who unintentionally and unconsciously came to form a clique with certain causal powers with the result that they by their interconnected activities (behaviors) caused the freezing out to take place. And, to account for the persistence requirement, A and B (the members of the clique) may have adopted a social practice – recurrent social activities – of the kind resulting, as an unintended consequence, in continuous freezing out of such members as C.

The phenomenon of the clique case is an interesting and important case in that it demonstrates the (possible) existence of groups of the non-transparent kind – while, if I am right, it does not require the postulation of a generic ontological entity as a “corporate body”. Let me add that, indeed, the voluminous literature on “unintended consequences” in the social sciences is in part concerned precisely with the present kind of phenomenon of non-intentional causation.

In his discussion of the ontology of groups, Graham argues that we require vocabulary to speak of irreducibly collective actions and that this requires the postulation of collective entities. He even says, “an irreducibly collective action requires an irreducibly collective agent” (p. 82). But even a simple joint action such as carrying a table or singing a duet can be taken to provide a counterexample to this claim: in such cases some agents perform the irreducible collective action, and there is no need to postulate an ontologically committing entity to account for agency. If more persistence is required we can generalize the present account and speak of irreducible social practices performed by some individuals acting as group members. There is a group involved here of course, but it suffices to deal with it in an “adverbial” sense starting with the idea that some individuals form a group, viz. share some relevant properties or satisfy a relevant “collectivity predicate”.

Graham seems to take collective entities to exist as corporate bodies on the ground that they are part of the best descriptions of the social world, as he ends the section by saying this: “And if the criterion for an entity’s existing is that ineliminable reference to it occurs in our best descriptions of the world, then collectivities exist.” (p. 83) However, it is far from clear that this needs to be regarded as a true statement. I would rather say that best explanations determine what the best descriptions are and thus what the ultimate explananda are. Some correction surely is needed in the social case to avoid e.g. taking the word ‘witch’ to refer to an existing entity. The same caution in linking language to ontology is needed in the case of collectivities.

Graham argues that collectivities can be both moral agents and moral patients. The general line of argument here is that collectivities are sufficiently alike also in moral respects to warrant analogous attributions of moral characteristics. I will here accept these ideas and will not discuss them in detail, even if they are central for the book.

Chapter 4 discusses collective identification and dissociation. Graham distinguishes between three types of collective identification: 1) primitive identification which is based on instrumental advancement of individual interests; 2) mediated identification which is instrumental but also takes into account the persons with shared characteristics and thus is not strictly egoistic; 3) pure identification in which the group and its activities are intrinsically valued: “it is what we achieve that matters to us” (p. 124) In the terminology I have used in my books we can say that collective identification in the fullest, pure sense amounts to thinking and acting in the we-mode (on instrumental or intrinsic grounds and fully or only partly for the group or collectivity), where we-mode thinking and action requires doing it as a group member in a group-committed way and at least in part for the use of the group.

Chapter 5 is concerned with the sources and (material and other) constraints on practical reasoning. Here constraints of necessity and of precondition are accordingly discussed. There is also a discussion of the primacy of individual versus collective agency. Graham takes both kinds to be on a par. However, he does not discuss joint agency. We-mode joint agency can be argued to ontically (although not conceptually) exhaust collective agency (cf. my earlier remarks and Tuomela, 1995).

Chapter 6 connects issues of practical reasoning to morality. Space does not permit a long discussion, but let me take up a point related to the topics of solidarity, altruism, and self-interest (Section 6.3). The discussion here relates to Hollis’ (1998) two views of teams and action done for the good of teams. Graham proposes an alternative view (p. 179):

In the hybrid third option, teams do transcend their members in the familiar sense that there is a range of predicates which are irreducibly applicable to the team but not to its members, and teams do have a good which transcends that of their members in the same sense of irreducibility. But their good does not transcend that of their members in the sense of taking precedence over, or determining, it.

This I find acceptable and applicable also to the view of teams as systems of joint we-mode agency.

My overall conclusion about Graham’s book is that it is informative and rich in content. It is also competently written, although, as we have seen, some of his arguments are vulnerable. I recommend the book to readers who want to see the relevance of action theory, and especially the theory of social and collective action, to central issues in social, political, and moral philosophy.


Hollis, M., 1998, Trust Within Reason, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.

Tuomela, R., 1984, A Theory of Social Action, Reidel, Dordrecht and Boston.

Tuomela, R. 1995, The Importance of Us: A Philosophical Study of Basic Social Notions, Stanford Series in Philosophy, Stanford University Press, Stanford.

Tuomela, R., 2002, The Philosophy of Social Practices: A Collective Acceptance View, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.