Practical Rules: When We Need Them and When We Don't

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Goldman, Alan H., Practical Rules: When We Need Them and When We Don't, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 222pp., $55.00 (hbk.), ISBN 0521807298.

Reviewed by Henry S. Richardson, Georgetown University


Philosophy lending itself so easily to abstraction, it is often useful to ask, whenever philosophers use the word, who “we” are. In the case of Alan Goldman’s wide-ranging new book on the usefulness of rules, the question is: Who is it that might need rules or might not? Philosophers, who might need rules to capture the truth-conditions of morality or the contours of moral facts? Or ordinary people, who might need rules in their everyday reasoning, or at least in reasoning well? Much recent work on moral particularism, such as Jonathan Dancy’s, has concentrated on the first sort of question, which deals with issues about the relation between moral thoughts and their truth-makers. Thinking along these lines, one can recognize the moral or practical significance of such facts as that Sam is suffering or that one’s new shoes are being rained on, yet start to have difficulties modeling the way that constellations of such particular facts might stand behind, and make true, general principles about helping the suffering or rescuing damp shoes. Much recent work on moral and practical reasoning, by contrast, such as my own, Jonsen and Toulmin’s, and Bernard Gert’s, sets aside metaphysical questions about the truth-makers in order to concentrate on perspicuous ways of modeling (normatively or descriptively) how it is that we deliberate about moral and practical problems. Sometimes, of course, philosophers find fruitful ways of bringing the metaphysical questions into illuminating contact with those of moral psychology: here the work of Joseph Raz is exemplary.

While Goldman’s primary focus is on the moral-psychological questions about whether we, as ordinary people, need moral, prudential, or legal rules, he proceeds to answer these questions within a metaphysically constrained notion of what counts as a “genuine” rule. In general, he is skeptical of the usefulness and importance of “strong” genuine rules, which always provide sufficient grounds of action, but supportive of the usefulness and importance of “weak” genuine rules, which always provide reasons for action.

Goldman distinguishes genuine rules from “pseudorules.” Genuine rules state in purely nonmoral and non-normative terms what is required, prohibited, or permitted, whereas pseudorules ineliminably employ moral or normative terms (16). He offers two principal reasons for setting aside pseudorules. The first appeals to the shibboleth of “complete moral reasoning,” understood as moral reasoning that begins “from descriptions couched in nonmoral terms, from natural properties that are held to be morally relevant” (13). The second ground anticipates his own constructive account of practical reasoning, which emphasizes reasoning that extends weak rules by appealing to analogies with settled cases. Since he takes it that normative and moral terms will be systematically subject to disagreements, he holds that applying strong rules employing such terms will also call for analogical reasoning. The conclusion seems to be that appeal to strong pseudorules is simply a dodge, serving only as a futile attempt to stave off the admission that it is not wise to proceed deductively from strong rules. I will return at the end of this review to Goldman’s alternative account of practical reasoning. Let me first, however, probe these reasons for setting aside rules containing moral or other normative terms as merely “pseudo.”

As to the first, it is certainly conceivable that some philosophers have a commitment to a sort of view – “called naturalism by an abuse of language,” as Rawls noted (1999, 506) – according to which all truths, and hence, ideally, all reasoning, ought to be traced to a nonmoral and non-normative basis. Rawls himself famously turned away from such a demand, providing a fairly thorough model of some of our reasoning about justice without making any attempt to trace everything back to a nonmoral basis. While he made no pretense that his account of our sense of justice was “complete,” it has seemed to many to provide some insight. Finding such normatively “internal” accounts as Rawls’s illuminating, and taking Goldman’s goal of complete moral reasoning to be neither attractive nor attainable, I am wholly unmoved by his first reason for concentrating on “genuine” rules.

Goldman’s second reason for this focus is less dogmatic, but equally unpersuasive. To elaborate it somewhat, it is that well-designed genuine rules generally lend themselves to non-problematic, non-inferential application, whereas pseudorules generally give rise to, or mask, practical disagreements (108). Each of these generalizations exaggerates. As an example of a rule lending itself to non-inferential application, Goldman mentions, “Stop at red lights.” It is unquestionably true that competent drivers tend to obey some such rule without engaging in inference; but it woefully oversimplifies what is going on to suggest that they are literally applying, in some tacitly deductive way, the rule as stated. Imagine a competent driver proceeding along the Strip in Las Vegas, stopping at every bright bit of red neon, and being roundly cursed by the drivers behind him. It seems that the rule actually refers, not to all lights of a certain color visible from the roadway, but rather to all officially positioned lights of a kind that traffic generally ought to obey. That is, this is in fact a crypto-pseudorule: it essentially employs normative terms, picking out lights in terms of their legal status; yet it poses no serious issues of disagreement. In the other direction, non-normative descriptions can clearly be controversial. Lawmakers in the U.S. will be facing such issues now as they attempt to regulate fetal stem-cell research. With such fast-developing possibilities as somatic-cell nuclear-transfer technology, it has come to be disputed whether a given set of research materials counts, descriptively, as fetal stem-cell tissue. Here on the descriptive side, too, we are often forced to reason by analogy to settled cases. Surprisingly, Goldman himself (108) instances H. L. A. Hart’s famous case of a war-memorial statue of a jeep as purportedly violating the rule, “no vehicles in the park.” Here there is disagreement that seems to turn on the interpretation of the apparently non-normative term, “vehicle.” The fact that, as Goldman rightly points out, this disagreement can, in turn, be explained by reference to the purposes for which this rule was enacted seems irrelevant to determining whether the distinction between genuine and “pseudo” rules is an important one. Perhaps, however, he means to make his filter blocking normative terms a fine-meshed one, for he later gives as an example of a normative term “restraint of trade” as used in the Sherman Anti-trust Act. Here, the inference seems to be that, since this term gives rise to important disagreements of interpretation, it is a normative one. But this stipulation threatens to cast all terms as normative ones – at least in certain contexts.

In general, then, one might wish that Goldman had not concentrated on so-called genuine rules to the exclusion of rules employing moral and normative terms. Rules of the latter sort seem to be what we actually employ in our ordinary moral, prudential, and legal reasoning. By importing this metaphysical constraint into his discussion of moral psychology, Goldman thus hampers rather than enhances his prospects for illuminating the subject. Let us set aside this complaint, however, and proceed to what Goldman has to say about the usefulness of genuine rules.

The book’s negative thesis, argued in three somewhat different ways for the three domains of morality, prudence, and the law, is that strong genuine rules – rules that sufficiently and exceptionlessly indicate what ought to be done in all circumstances of a certain type without leaning on moral or normative predicates – have little actual or appropriate place in any of these domains. In each case, one cannot escape wondering whether Goldman’s opponent has any vital stuffing. Repeatedly, Goldman complains that defenders of rules have been guilty of equivocating between genuine and pseudorules or between strong and weak ones; but this charge would be plausible only if these theorists had intended to assert the importance of strong, genuine rules, and this remains doubtful. Here, the fact that Goldman is working within moral psychology makes his case all the easier. It is more plausible that, as a moral realist might speculate, there is a set of “real” moral rules that are strong and genuine and capture all the truths of morality, but that unfortunately remain unknown to us, than that we actually know and use any significant set of strong, genuine moral rules. There are indeed defenders of the claim that we do – most of them, to my knowledge, adherents of natural-law morality. Their position, however, is not one that Goldman takes up.

The book’s positive arguments about the usefulness of rules are actually more interesting than its negative thesis. The book’s positive claim is that weak, genuine rules, ones that simply indicate factors or reasons that are always relevant in certain types of circumstance, are indeed appropriately useful in each of the three domains of practical reasoning. Goldman purports to have discovered a new basis for showing the importance of weak, genuine rules, which – for the case of morality – he explains in terms of a “moral-moral” generalized prisoners’ dilemma. It is doubly moral in that it arises for agents who are morally motivated but yields collective results that are less than morally optimal. His prime illustration of such a situation is that of a bankruptcy-court judge deciding whether to evict an elderly widow. In such a case, it is plausible that the morally best decision would be not to evict, but that the “cumulative effect of many judges reasoning on these grounds” (43) would be deleterious. Theoretically, an optimal intermediate solution may exist that would evict only a certain percentage of such widows – either on the basis of an arbitrary randomizing device or (more likely within the law) on the basis of a more finely specified principle; but Goldman, unlike some of the great jurisprudential thinkers of the past, does not trust the genius of the common law to evolve towards such solutions.

This positive argument being one of this book’s potentially novel contributions, it would have been nice had the structure of the problem received a somewhat more explicit analysis. For instance, the sort of collective-action problem on which the argument builds is said to be intermediate between a pure prisoners’-dilemma problem and a pure coordination problem. This being an issue that lends itself to precise, quantitative analysis, it would have been helpful to see this claim worked out, if only in an appendix. A more serious flaw in the argument’s presentation is that it is ambiguous in the way of the last paragraph as to whether the “cumulative effects” on which it focuses are actual or hypothetical. If Goldman has the actual effects of an individual decision in mind, then it would be puzzling why a morally motivated judge would not simply factor them in. If instead – as seems more likely – it is the hypothetically considered effects of all judges, or a lot of judges, deciding cases in that same way that Goldman means us to worry about, then another puzzlement arises. If the argument centrally turns on a hypothetical generalization of an individual decision, how is it that the author could have proceeded without engaging, at least in the notes, with the vast literature on hypothetical generalization in ethics, of which Marcus Singer’s book was a kind of high-water mark?

A similar lack of engagement with centrally relevant literature mars the book’s final chapter, which presents a theory of the kind of practical reasoning that deploys weak, genuine rules. Here we get an attractive but sketchy account of case-based analogical reasoning that has not taken account of the more refined versions of such a theory developed and presented by Jonsen and Toulmin, Hurley, and Sunstein. Further, the book’s leading ideas about how such reasoning would reach closure are seriously problematic. There are two: the notion of which paradigm case is “closest” to the one at hand and the idea of a “maximally coherent” set of considered judgments. The first idea depends on a metric of closeness, something that Thomas Kuhn at one point famously sought and as famously failed to find. The idea of coherence, in its turn (as Millgram has argued), is too vague and multiplex to serve as a criterion of closure.

A deeper worry about Goldman’s theory of reasoning is perhaps traceable back to his rejection of so-called pseudorules. Although he embraces aspects of Rawls’s idea of reflective equilibrium, such as its notion of movement towards coherence among considered judgments, he refuses to take seriously our commitment to principles. The criterion he attempts to articulate pertains to maximal coherence among our particular considered judgments and not, as Rawls would have it, among our considered judgments at all levels of generality. Absent a more strongly particularist metaphysical constraint than Goldman has at his disposal, however, it is hard to see why considered judgments that are abstract and general should not be seen as appropriately playing a central role in our moral, prudential, and legal reasoning.

It is a shame that this book does not engage more seriously with actual opponents and with crucial aspects of the literature potentially supportive of its views, for Goldman’s discussions proceed with patient clarity and offer many insights of detail into the theories (such as Nozick’s account of prudence) that he does discuss.


Dancy, Jonathan, Moral Reasons, Blackwell, 1993.

Gert, Bernard, Morality: Its Nature and Justification, Oxford University Press, 1998.

Hurley, Susan, Natural Reasons: Personality and Polity, Oxford University Press, 1989.

Jonsen, Albert, and Stephen Toulmin, The Abuse of Casuistry, University of California Press, 1988.

Millgram, Elijah, “Coherence: The Price of the Ticket,” Journal of Philosophy 97 (2000): 82-93.

Rawls, John, A Theory of Justice, rev. ed., Harvard University Press, 1999.

Raz, Joseph, Practical Reason and Norms, rev. ed., Princeton University Press, 1990.

Richardson, Henry S., Practical Reasoning about Final Ends, Cambridge University Press, 1994.

Singer, Marcus George, Generalization in Ethics, Knopf, 1961.

Sunstein, Cass, Legal Reasoning and Political Conflict, Oxford University Press, 1996.