Practical Shape: A Theory of Practical Reasoning

Placeholder book cover

Jonathan Dancy, Practical Shape: A Theory of Practical Reasoning, Oxford University Press, 2018, 185pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198805441.

Reviewed by Paolo Monti, Università Cattolica del Sacro Cuore


Debates over the various features and incarnations of practical reasoning are among the most longstanding in the history of practical philosophy and have been thoroughly explored in contemporary moral epistemology. One of the main points of contention has been whether we should accept that practical reasoning concludes in an action or if, instead, it ends in a mental state that can then lead to action. The question is relevant, as it opens the door to substantially different understandings of what (if anything) connects our thinking to our actions, how our actions can be considered rational, and when and how our reasoning fails to produce appropriate interactions with the world and the others.

In his book, Jonathan Dancy takes a stance on this controversy, supporting the notion that we can, indeed, reason (directly) to action. In the process, however, he does much more than that, providing a general account of reasoning, considering the specifics of a significant array of its species and subspecies, and addressing in detail some of the most influential alternative views on the topic. Dancy does all of this competently and comprehensively, as he relies on his vast and impactful previous work in the field. The book in itself is nonetheless a standalone work that anyone interested in the topic can approach without a previous understanding of the author's view.

At its core, the book articulates an original theory of reasoning that espouses [a] the Aristotelian notion that practical reasoning is reasoning to action (Aristotle 2014: 118) while also adhering to the Kantian claim that [b] theoretical reasoning, as reasoning to belief, is not substantially different from the former "because in the end there can be only one and the same reason, which must differ merely in its application" (Kant 2012: 7). These claims come with important specifications that characterize the author's Neo-Aristotelian stance: [a] that practical reasoning is reasoning to action, but, unlike Aristotle, Dancy does not think that all practical reasoning is syllogistic (13); and [b] that practical and theoretical reasoning share a common root, but the practical side has some primacy over the other since even "in believing we are as active as we ever are" (175), and in this sense, we are operating as agents both when we theoretically decide what is so and when we practically decide what to do. Reasoning is [a] not necessarily an inferential process, but it is always about [b] responding correctly to a state of affairs by coming to believe or act in a certain way based on appropriate reasons that favour that response. Dancy is, in fact, supporting a realist theory that pictures the subject of reasoning as someone engaged with a situation that demands some form of theoretical or practical response. In the practical realm, this situation always comes with a specific "practical shape" (hence the book's title) that is a "configuration of considerations relevant to one's choice of action" (3). The reasoning process is aimed at shaping one's own thinking in a way that captures this configuration appropriately.

Dancy develops this overall picture in a series of steps that first articulate and defend general claims [a] and [b], then consider the specific cases of moral and instrumental reasoning, and finally tackle two alternative pictures sketched by Joseph Raz and John Broome. Let us consider these steps in order.

Chapter 1 illustrates the lines of criticism raised against the Aristotelian thesis, which maintains that practical reasoning leads to action. The main point behind this criticism is that reasoning cannot immediately end in action, but rather in a belief that, in turn, can mediately lead us to action. We usually act according to this belief, such as with the belief "that it would be best, or right, to act this way," but, if we follow this approach, the transition from thinking to acting is a separate problem from that of reasoning. The intuitive distinction between reasoning, which is a process of our mind, and acting, which is mostly connected with something we do with our body, reinforces the plausibility of this critique.

In Chapter 2, Dancy turns "from destruction to construction" (26) and reconsiders the whole problem by suggesting that the plausibility of the critiques raised against the Aristotelian view stem from a substantially misguided way of framing the problem. He argues that if the critics were correct, there would, in fact, be no proper practical reasoning, but only instances of theoretical reasoning that end in some belief for which we subsequently find a practical use. This skewed perspective comes from the priority often bestowed upon theoretical reasoning, especially in its inferential form, that ends up functioning as a model for understanding its practical counterpart. To recognize the peculiarity of practical reasoning and reconcile it with the theoretical one, we need a different account of reasoning altogether, centred on the favouring relation. Following this line of thinking, our practical reasoning can be construed as a way of directly taking a stance in a given situation by acting according to what is favoured by the relevant aspects of that situation.

Chapter 3 further clarifies this stance by articulating its realist character: the form of our deliberation is, in effect, to be understood as an attempt to match the practical shape of the situation, so that "in the process of deliberation we acquire our sense of how to respond to it, a sense that is expressed in action" (61).

Having qualified his understanding of claim [a], in Chapter 4 Dancy moves on to the justification of claim [b] by coming back to theoretical reasoning in light of his approach centered on the favouring relation. The gist of this section is to show how the structures of theoretical reasoning mirror those of practical reasoning: the latter ends in an action, while the former ends in a belief, but both are processes of appropriately responding to the relevant aspects of the situation under consideration. The explanations we offer for the normative relationship we establish when looking at what favours belief or disbelief are different from those we offer in the practical realm, but at the core, we are always formulating a response to a situation that challenges us.

Chapter 5 considers the first specific form of practical reasoning: moral reasoning. The case of moral reasoning is especially interesting because it includes both reasoning to a belief that dictates what is morally right, thus leaning toward the theoretical side, and reasoning about what to do in a certain situation, and, therefore, leaning toward the practical side. Both reasoning to moral belief and reasoning to action, however, can be understood as attempts to articulate a response to a situation that confronts us with what we (or someone else) ought to be doing in it. Consistent with his work on particularism in ethics and with his qualified claim [a], Dancy here rejects the notion that our moral reasoning is necessarily inferential. He suggests instead that, when deliberating on moral matters, we consider reasons that favour acting in a certain way because those reasons reveal some moral value attached to acting a certain way (85). In turn, this understanding of moral reasoning also confirms his qualified claim [b] and the primacy of the practical: moral reasons are relevant in our deliberation because they favour a certain way of acting and only secondarily because they favour the belief that we ought to act that way.

Chapter 6 is a step of consolidation and systematization of what has been done in the previous sections. Reasoning in general is now presented in the light of a unified understanding, as a process that moves from a certain conception of the situation we are in to a response that is favoured by the relevant considerations as we see them. The response will be a belief in instances of theoretical reasoning and an action in instances of practical reasoning. And while we explain our favouring certain beliefs based on considerations concerning the probability of truth, we explain our favouring certain actions based on appeals to values. The importance of these differences, however, should not be overstated, since we can understand truth itself as a value (98), thus re-establishing a certain degree of unification by once again opting for a primacy of the practical in our understating of reasoning.

In Chapter 7, Dancy explores a second specific form of practical reasoning: instrumental reasoning (in several variations). He rejects the view that practical reasoning necessarily takes the form of instrumental reasoning, instead insisting, in anti-Humean fashion, that our reasoning about means is not required just to accept ends preassigned by desire and that there can also be reasoning about ends. With this perspective, Dancy also investigates the difficulties connected with deliberation on autobiographical premises and the different attitudes that we, as deliberators, can have about our own desires.

Chapters 8 and 9, address two views that appear incompatible with Dancy's theory. Specifically, he considers Raz's thesis, which positions practical reasoning as, ultimately, a process to "practical beliefs" (130), as well as Broome's claim that all practical reasoning is reasoning to an intention (145), both in patent opposition to Dancy's claim [a]. To meet this challenge, Dancy reaffirms that in the practical realm, the focus of our reasoning is not beliefs or intentions, but acting (169). He does also acknowledge a significant proximity to Raz's understanding of the belief formation process as an active one: because of the primacy of the practical, our reasoning to belief is indeed seen as an active engagement through which we make evaluations, form opinions, and come to a view (144). Finally, Chapter 10 addresses some loose ends concerning the theory's relationship with Humeanism, Pragmatism, and Anscombe's perspective, followed by a brief closing summary.

An important disclaimer: there is much in the book that I could not touch on in this short overview, but which deserves attention. This includes some finely crafted discussions of relevant views such as Stephen E. Toulmin on substantive and formal argumentation, Gilbert Harman on practical reasoning, and Elizabeth Anscombe and Anselm Müller on intention. Dancy's work is elegant and concis. He manages to move many pieces on the chessboard without losing sight of delineating his Neo-Aristotelian theory of practical reasoning.

Alongside this fundamental appreciation of the book, I would like to raise a few critical points. I will focus on claim [a], that the concluding element of practical reasoning is action, which is probably the book's most controversial.

To defend the claim, in Chapter 6, Dancy engages with Robert Audi, a major proponent of an opposing stance: that the concluding element of practical reasoning is not action, but a judgement in favour of future action. Audi argues that the Aristotelian view runs into several difficulties:

It makes practical reasoning a hybrid process composed of what is, intuitively, reasoning and, on the other hand, action based on it. It leaves us with no adequate account of the concluding of that reasoning. And it fails to accommodate cases in which the action that should be the concluding element does not occur. (Audi 2006: 71)

Dancy focuses especially on the third point, and his counterargument is twofold. First, substantially, he argues that instances of practical reasoning that are not followed by action are merely incomplete, yet incompleteness is not an argument to dismiss that those are still pieces of thinking that, in their complete form, end in action. As we easily accept that "a car without a wheel is still a car" (104), we should also accept that practical reasoning without a concluding action is still practical reasoning. Second, methodologically, Dancy suggests that the aim of his inquiry is "to come to an understanding of practical reasoning by giving an account of certain instances, carefully chosen for the purpose, and offering to understand other putative cases in the light of those" (105). This is what he calls a focalist programme, which forgoes the ambition of providing a complete account of the necessary and sufficient conditions of practical reasoning as such. He instead focuses on the successful and complete cases of practical reasoning and understands other cases, including the incomplete ones, based on their similarity to the former. This twofold counterargument is, I think, insightful but not entirely convincing.

The substantial side of the argument looks unpersuasive, especially if we look at the full characterization of the alternative view that reasoning ends in judgement. Audi construes judgement as a response to a practical question the subject is confronted with: at the end of an instance of practical reasoning, practical judgment provides content that is appropriate to answer the question and accepting this content on the basis of the premises of reasoning is a prima facie response to it. Moreover, he adds,

the view that such judging is the concluding element captures part of the Aristotelian idea that (successful) practical reasoning concludes in action, just as theoretical reasoning (typically) concludes in belief. For judging that, say I must repay a loan, is doing something, though it is probably not action under direct voluntary control. (Audi 2006: 72)

This characterization does multiple things: frames practical reasoning as a process that is responsive to the problem presented by the situation, closely parallels the structure of theoretical reasoning, stresses the active aspect of judgement, but also gets away from the problems created by the processes of deliberation that do not end in action. In many ways, Audi's view seems to capture the gist of Dancy's qualified claim [b] while avoiding the controversial aspects of claim [a]. This is also the case, as was pointed out, with Raz's perspective on practical belief that Dancy discusses in Chapter 8 (Raz 2011).

In light of this fuller picture, Dancy's rebuttal seems less convincing. First, practical reasoning that gets to the formulation of a judgement appears to be complete even when, for whatever reason, action does not follow. Specifically, instances of practical reasoning that do not conclude in the deliberated action, due to physical impediment or weakness of will (intended as acting against one's own best judgement), are not incomplete. The metaphor of incompleteness offered by Dancy is somewhat puzzling: an instance of practical reasoning that ends in judgment but not in action is more comparable to a mechanically complete car that cannot be driven in the expected way or direction rather than to a "car without a wheel." This certainly presents the problem of understanding why the car does not operate as expected, but a similar problem arises if we engage with the explanation of why it lacks a wheel.

Second, Audi's picture of practical reasoning is still distinct enough from theoretical reasoning that concludes in belief, contrary to Dancy's conviction that claim [a] is usually rejected because practical reasoning is effectively assimilated to the theoretical. Audi's practical judgements are active conclusions that can be construed as a form of "doing" in the face of a practical question, not just beliefs for which we then find a practical use. Furthermore, according to him, making a judgement does not entail belief. It appears, then, that Audi's account is successful in addressing the concerns behind claim [b] without subscribing to claim [a]. This observation could be taken further by noting that, in many ways, Audi's account is compatible with Dancy's even if it adopts a moderate inferential model. In Audi's perspective, in fact, intentional action can be a response to the relevant considerations dictated by the situation without being the product of an inferential process, but the favouring can then be reconstructively explained in inferential terms: "even when S does not act on the basis of practical reasoning that expresses the underlying practical argument, such reasoning may be invoked reconstructively by the agent (or indeed someone else)" (Audi 2006: 89). One could then embrace Dancy's claim that the structure of practical reasoning is not necessarily inferential but more generally captured by the favouring relation while also claiming that the favouring can be nonetheless reconstructively explained in inferential terms.

Moving to the methodological side of Dancy's argument, which is the adoption of a focalist programme, things are not entirely clear, especially when it comes to its application as portrayed in the book. Dancy presents the approach in three steps: "First, we identify certain cases as focal . . . Second, we determine a similarity relation between the focal cases and any peripheral cases. Third, we identify a dependence relation that holds between the focal and the peripheral cases" (105-6). Focal cases are ideal cases of complete and successful practical reasoning, the understanding of which will be later extended to peripheral cases that include incomplete instances of practical reasoning not ending in actions. The approach itself is fair, but it remains unclear what the criteria of similarity are that allow for the establishment of relevant relations. Dancy directs the reader to his theory presented in Chapter 3. But there he illustrates the different ways in which considerations are relevant in the practical shape of a situation, which is not necessarily sufficient for identifying the similarities of ideal cases with flawed and incomplete instances of reasoning, where the considerations raised are not relevant or action does not appear as the concluding element. Reasoning not concluding in action may be unrelated to the role played within the process by the relevant considerations; think of the case of weakness of will, which intervenes after the deliberation already ended in a judgement. It therefore remains to be seen what justifies the extension of the ideal case to the incomplete case if we cannot account for its incompleteness.

Much more could be said about this valuable piece of scholarship that cannot properly be articulated in this review. Dancy states in the Acknowledgements that he intends this to be his last book (xiii). What we can easily recognize is that this is another worthy contribution from Dancy to the areas of inquiry he has devoted his career to. Hopefully, the philosophical debate will still benefit in the future from his continued activity.


Aristotle (2014) Nicomachean Ethics, trans. C.D.C. Reeve. Indianapolis and Cambridge: Hackett.

Audi, R. (2006) Practical Reasoning and Ethical Decision. London and New York: Routledge.

Kant, I. (2012) Groundwork of the Metaphysics of Morals, trans. M. Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Raz, J. (2011) From Normativity to Responsibility. Oxford: Oxford University Press.