Practical Shape: A Theory of Practical Reasoning

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Jonathan Dancy, Practical Shape: A Theory of Practical Reasoning, Oxford University Press, 2018, 185pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198805441.

Reviewed by John Hyman, University College London


Jonathan Dancy’s new book, which he says in the preface he intends to be his last, defends the idea that there is a “common core” to practical and theoretical reasoning, in other words, to reasoning whose purpose is to guide action and reasoning whose purpose is to guide belief, and that “theoretical reasoning is not that core” (p. 2).

Defending this idea is a challenge. The conventional view is that reasoning is inference, the “passage of thought” from premises — propositions the reasoner accepts as true, at least for the sake of argument — to a conclusion. This process is subject to rules or norms, which logicians explain and codify, whose purpose is to license or allow some inferences and disallow some others. The rules are not arbitrary, and reasoning is not a parlour game, because the inferences allowed are ones in which the truth of the premises ensures the truth of the conclusion. Truth is therefore the value or desideratum that reasoning aims to preserve. Reasoning can guide action no less than belief. But the conclusion of an inference is something capable of being believed, as opposed to something capable of being done. Hence, reasoning guides belief directly, whereas it guides action only indirectly, by guiding belief.

For all the clarifications and qualifications it requires, the conventional view sets an agenda for philosophers who are unwilling to subordinate practical reasoning to theoretical reasoning in this way. Are the premises and conclusion in a piece of practical reasoning propositions? If not, what are they? How are we to distinguish between practical reasoning that is valid and practical reasoning that is invalid or fallacious? What are the rules, and what is the value that valid practical reasoning preserves?

The most sophisticated attempt to reject the conventional view, and to defend the idea that practical reasoning has a logic of its own, was made by Anthony Kenny fifty years ago.1 According to Kenny, the premises of a practical inference include a “fiat”, the content of a volition — as opposed to a proposition, the content of a belief — together with propositions concerning the means by which it can be fulfilled. The conclusion of the inference is also a fiat, in effect a plan to fulfill the first. For example, if a doctor’s goal is to cure a patient with an infection, she may reason as follows:

The patient’s infection shall be treated!
If the patient is given an antibiotic her infection will be treated.
Penicillin is an antibiotic.
So the patient shall be given penicillin!

Whereas the rules of theoretical reasoning are designed to ensure that we do not pass from true premises to a false conclusion, the rules of practical reasoning are designed to ensure that we do not pass from a plan that provides a satisfactory means of achieving a goal to one that does not. Hence, whereas a valid theoretical inference preserves truth, a valid practical inference preserves satisfactoriness, relative to a goal or set of goals.

According to Kenny, the logic of practical inference is the mirror image of the logic of theoretical inference. Thus, we can confirm that the practical inference above is valid by turning it upside down, replacing the imperative sentences with indicative ones, and confirming that the theoretical inference from the proposition that the patient will be given penicillin to the conclusion that her infection will be treated is valid.

Like Kenny, Dancy rejects the conventional view that practical reasoning is just theoretical reasoning applied to practical questions. Unlike Kenny, he does not have a theory of practical inference to offer in its place. He dismisses the idea of an inference whose conclusion is a fiat, and he acknowledges that an act cannot itself be the conclusion of an inference, as Aristotle is sometimes said to have maintained. The alternative he prefers is “to abandon talk of practical inference altogether” (p. 24). There is practical reasoning. It is “a process in which we try to work out how to respond to the situation which confronts us” (p. 97). But reasoning, he maintains, is not a kind of inference.

According to Dancy, reasoning is not a passage from premises to conclusions. Whether practical or theoretical, it is a passage from “considerations” to actions or beliefs they “favour”, or appear to favour. The book’s title, Practical Shape, refers to the “configuration of considerations relevant to one’s choice of action”, which one seeks to “capture in the mind” (p. 3). What is a consideration? It is a “state of affairs”, either one that obtains or one that appears to obtain. We can refer to a state of affairs by means of a that-clause, but it is not a proposition. “It is not the proposition that favours, but its truth, or that it is true — and that a proposition is true is itself a state of affairs” (pp. 39-40). And what is favouring? It is “an objective normative relation between considerations and responses” (p. 30), but “nobody has got near offering much of an account of it” (p. 29).

In Dancy’s view, reasoning in general “consists in an attempt to determine what sort of response is most favoured by the considerations at issue, and responding that way if one can” (p. 6). This is true whether the response consists in action (when we reason practically) or belief (when we reason theoretically). Furthermore, practical reasoning has a kind of priority over certain kinds of theoretical reasoning, in the following sense: if R is a reason to believe that one ought to do X, this is because it is a reason to do X. R favours the belief because it favours the action, and not the other way around. (Favouring an action is prior to favouring a decision or intention in the same way.)

When reasoning goes well, “we work from a detailed conception of the situation that confronts us to a response that is of the sort most favoured by the relevant considerations, taken as a whole” (p. 8). However, reasoning that does not go well still qualifies as reasoning, as long as it is “sufficiently similar to the good cases” (p. 6). For example, if someone “determine[s] what sort of response is most favoured by the considerations at issue”, but fails to act, this is a case of incomplete reasoning, but it is still a case of reasoning: “an incomplete instance of something is still an instance of that thing. An incomplete house is still a house — just not a complete one” (p. 104).

Dancy’s book offers an attractive outline of his conception of practical reasoning. Partly because of his informal style, it is a pleasure to read, and many of the sections into which each chapter is divided offer a simple argument, or a series of reflections on a puzzle or a concept, which provides a good springboard for discussion in a class. However, also partly because of the book’s informal style, and because of its brevity as well, there are places where the outline of Dancy’s position is puzzling or seems to need some filling in.

First, there is what Dancy calls “the famous, or infamous, favouring relation” (p. 28). Dancy declines to explain what favouring is, commenting blithely that he will set its infamy aside, and rely on its fame. But this is unsatisfactory, for two reasons. First, fame is not a guarantee of clarity: every reader will have her own examples of famous concepts that are irremediably obscure. Second, favouring is not difficult to define. Roughly, a reason favours a certain option or alternative, such as doing X or believing Y, if and only if it justifies it, or would do so in the absence of countervailing reasons; and to justify something, in the relevant sense, is to explain why it is just or right (see OED, justify, 6a).

Dancy rejects a similar definition, proposed by John Broome, on the grounds that it “obliterates” the normativity of the favouring relation:

everything is understood in terms of a contribution to the explanation of something normative; the normativity of the thing to be explained does not make the elements of that explanation normative in any way. (p. 96)

In other words, the favouring relation — or as Dancy also calls it the “calling-for” relation — is normative, whereas the explaining relation is not. Definitions like the one proposed above shift the normativity from the relation itself to one of the relata, that is, to the explanandum, It is just or right to do X or believe Y. And this “obliterates” the normativity of the relation itself.

But this is quite unconvincing. For comparison, suppose we define the north-of relation by saying that X is north of Y if and only if the distance between X and the North Pole is less than the distance between Y and the North Pole. Does this “obliterate” the spatiality of the north-of relation, since the less-than relation is merely quantitative, so everything is understood in terms of a contribution to the explanation of something spatial? Surely not. The definition does not eliminate or “obliterate” spatiality, because the spatial concept of distance is employed in the definiens, just as the normative concept of justice or rightness is employed in the definition of favouring proposed above.

Dancy is more forthcoming about the kind of thing that favours than he is about the favouring relation. His principal claims are that only what is the case can favour something, and that what is the case is not a proposition, but a state of affairs. Since premises are propositions, this is compatible with Dancy’s aim of thinking about practical reasoning independently of inference, although one can agree that reasons are not propositions without sharing this aim. And on the face of it, it sounds quite plausible that a state of affairs, something that is the case, favours doing X or believing Y. The idioms sit together nicely. But inevitably the detail is more worrisome.

What are propositions, and what are states of affairs? The Tractatus hovers in the background. Like Wittgenstein, Dancy holds that propositions represent states of affairs: a true proposition represents an actual or “obtaining” state of affairs, whereas a false proposition represents a merely possible state of affairs, one that does not “obtain”. But whereas Wittgenstein is thinking of a sentence — he uses the word “Satz” — Dancy embraces the paradoxical doctrine that a proposition, rather like the Cheshire cat, is a “naked” representation, without any non-representational properties — such as the syntactic properties of a sentence, or the colours that make up a painting — on which its representational properties could supervene. And whereas for Wittgenstein a state of affairs is a possible combination of objects, Dancy maintains that it consists in “things being this way rather than that way”, or “that the event occurred”. He sometimes conveys the impression that any “obtaining” state of affairs can favour doing X or believing Y, but at one point, as we saw above, he suggests that what favours is a specific kind of state of affairs, namely, a proposition’s being true: “It is not the proposition that favours, but its truth, or that it is true — and that a proposition is true is itself a state of affairs” (pp. 39-40).

It would take more space than is available to assess these ideas with the patience they deserve. But whether or not they form a coherent picture, it is difficult to discern an argument for the claim that it is states of affairs that “favour”, beyond the ease with which the various idioms Dancy dwells on can be combined. And while it is natural to say that such-and-such a state of affairs favours doing X or believing Y, it isn’t less natural to say that such-and-such a fact or idea or hypothesis does so. The problem is that it simply isn’t possible to devise a convincing argument for any doctrine about the kind of thing that favours without a definition of the favouring relation. How could we settle a debate about what the relata can be or must be, such as who can marry whom, in the absence of a definition of the relation? But as soon as we have a definition, the situation changes. For example, if we accept the definition of favouring proposed above, then we are bound to accept that the kind of thing that favours an option or alternative is an explanans, and therefore not a proposition, nor yet a state of affairs, but a fact.2 Regardless of whether this is the right approach, it illustrates the fact that clarity about the favouring relation is required for clarity about the kind of thing that favours.

The last topic I shall comment on is inference. Some writers, such as Anscombe, have expressed scepticism about the idea that inference is a kind of mental act or process:

That is the picture of a logical step: an act of mind which is making the step from premise to conclusion. . . . the dispute seemed one between people who all agreed there was such a thing as this ‘stepping’ for assertions or suppositions; but some thought they could see such a ‘step’ also in the case of practical inference, while others just couldn’t descry it at all. But there is no such thing in either case!3

The thoughts that occur to us when we acquire beliefs or make plans are usually fragmentary and disjointed, and a “Therefore”-thought does not need to occur. But what is an inference, if it is not a mental “step”? The minimal answer is that if the grounds on which someone acquires a belief or adopts a plan include a conditional or a quantified proposition (for example, If the patient is given an antibiotic her infection will be treated), then we say that the belief was acquired or the plan was adopted as a result of reasoning or inference. And we can evaluate their reasoning by setting out their grounds in sufficient detail to reveal fallacies or gaps, or to confirm that there are none. As Anscombe points out, the logical truths we employ for this purpose are the same, whether the conclusion is a belief or a plan, and in that sense there is only one logic, but the patterns in which we set out their grounds differ, so we can distinguish between theoretical and practical inference, if we wish.

Unlike Anscombe, Dancy maintains that inference is a mental process, and that it does consist in taking logical “steps”: “passing from beliefs to belief in a certain way” (p. 23), “tracking relations between propositions” (p. 41). But “reasoning” or “deliberation” is a different process, one in which we pass from “considerations” to “responses”, while “tracking the favouring relation”:

when we respond to considerations as reasons, we are tracking the favouring relation in which those considerations stand to a way of responding, or, as I tend to put it, acting in the light of those considerations. (p. 29)

“When an agent deliberates well and then acts accordingly,” Dancy concludes, “the action done is of the sort most favoured by the considerations rehearsed, taken as a whole” (p. 29).

If we set aside any concerns about the favouring relation, the problem with this conception of deliberation is that it has an inference-shaped hole in the middle. Suppose a doctor is aware of a “configuration of considerations”, states of affairs that she has captured in her mind: a patient’s needing to be treated for an infection, antibiotics’ being a suitable treatment for an infection, and penicillin’s being an antiobiotic. Ideally, practical reasoning will lead her to the response that is most favoured by these considerations, taken as a whole, which is prescribing penicillin. But how exactly does it do that? How does she “take” these considerations “as a whole”?

Perhaps she takes as premises the propositions corresponding to these state of affairs (The patient needs to be treated for an infection, etc.); infers (that is, takes the “mental step” to the conclusion), So penicillin is a suitable treatment for the patient; and then prescribes penicillin for this reason. Perhaps she takes as premises a fiat corresponding to the first consideration (The patient shall be treated for an infection!) and propositions corresponding to the others (Antibiotics are a suitable treatment for an infection, etc.); infers (ditto), So the patient shall be given penicillin!; and then prescribes penicillin in execution of this plan. But if she does neither of these things, what does she do? Absent an inference of some kind, what could the route from an awareness of a configuration of considerations to a response look like? According to Dancy, the aim of practical reasoning is “to capture the relevances of all the differently relevant features, in the attempt to determine which course of action is best suited to the demands of the situation” (p. 3). But he is silent on the question how we can achieve this without making inferences.

But what if Dancy adopted a more radical position, and denied that deliberation is a mental process? Would this relieve him of the need to fill the gap between the configuration of considerations and the response? Could he say that the doctor captures the configuration of considerations in her mind and prescribes penicillin “in the light” of them, and that is all there is to it? — perhaps adding that if we demand to know what the route taken by this mental process looks like, this is merely an expression of our adherence to a mythical conception of reasoning.

The problem is this. If there is reasoning, then there is valid and invalid reasoning. Dancy holds that reasoning is valid if, and only if, the “response” is “of the sort most favoured by the relevant considerations, taken as a whole”. Now even without a clear definition of the favouring relation, we can see that if the only relevant considerations are the patient’s having an infection that needs treatment, antibiotics being a suitable treatment for an infection, and penicillin’s being an antibiotic, then prescribing penicillin is “of the sort most favoured”, that is, it is the right thing to do. But although we can see this — the example being a simple one — we cannot explain it, except by showing that an inference is valid, specifically, one of the inferences above. In other words, the distinction between valid and invalid practical reasoning, as Dancy conceives of it, still depends on the distinction between valid and invalid practical inference, whether this is regarded as theoretical inference applied to practical questions, or as a sui generis form of inference, of Kenny’s sort. So a study of practical reasoning cannot “abandon talk of practical inference altogether” (p. 24), as Dancy announces he will do. The inference-shaped hole remains, whether it is a hole in a process, or merely in a theory.

Dancy’s is an attractive book, engagingly personal in style, and full of thoughtful and interesting material. But the gaps in the argument and the unanswered questions are no less interesting, so let us hope that it will not be his last.


The author gratefully acknowledges the support of the ERC under the European Union’s Horizon 2020 research and innovation programme (project ID: 789270).

1 A.J.P. Kenny, ‘Practical Inference’, Analysis 26 (1966), pp. 65-75.

2 See J. Hyman, Action, Knowledge, and Will (Oxford: OUP, 2015), ch.6.

3 G.E.M. Anscombe, ‘Von Wright on Practical Inference’, in P.A. Schilpp and L.E. Hahn (eds.), The Philosophy of Georg Henrik Von Wright (La Salle, Ill.: Open Court, 1989), p. 393.